Spinoza and Deep Ecology: Challenging Traditional Approaches to Environmentalism

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Eccy De Jonge, Spinoza and Deep Ecology: Challenging Traditional Approaches to Environmentalism, Ashgate Publishing, 2004, 172pp, $79.95 (hbk), ISBN 0754633276.

Reviewed by Karen Houle, University of Alberta



Spinoza and Deep Ecology, in Ashgate's New Critical Thinking in Philosophy series, is a dense little gem arranged into two sections, one working Deep Ecology over in light of its core normative claims and metaphysical enframing; the second, working Deep Ecology over in light of its affiliative claims to Baruch Spinoza. Eccy de Jonge rescues one thread, the concept of 'self-realization', as a viable connector between these two philosophical projects. As if these exegetical scourings were not enough to destabilize Deep Ecology as solid philosophy and proper kin of Spinoza, de Jonge turns, at the end of the book, toward Spinoza's political theory. Ideal democracy, Spinoza argued, is the form of state required to underwrite the activation of the self and the perseverance of self in its being. As such, it is a form of governance and a set of associated values (rational deliberation, freedom from harm, respect for persons) repudiated by 'the sort of politics associated with Deep Ecology [which] includes forms of violent direct action' (ix), including Earth First! and other terrestrial and aquatic ecosaboteurs. Deep Ecology, the author urges, needs to divorce itself fully from this sort of radical political action if it is to be true to the key vestige of Spinozistic-Ecological thought: the perseverance in activity through "deep questioning" of our inadequate ideas. De Jonge's book does little to revive Deep Ecology's reputation as respectable philosophy. In fact, it sets up extra rounds and pummels the hell out of it. However, nowhere in the work does the reader get the sense that 'the environment' is on the author's radar as the chief object of concern and intervention. In this, de Jonge stands across a chasm from Deep Ecologists. That fact will disappoint many who might look to such a work for new visions of the intermarriage of Spinoza and Green thought. The book does, however, by virtue of its remarkable analysis of the potency of Spinozistic thought, remind us that Spinoza can take us a long way toward getting the right ideas (and hence the right feelings, which are the ideas under a different description, or aspect) of love and suffering; and understanding the constitutive or corrupting impact of these on all the finite modes of God or Nature, humans and otherwise. These modes, their specific conatus, and the adequate or inadequate ideas held about them can also be 'questioned' by active personal and political selves. This good green thought leaps the chasm! A rich and intriguing link to 'the environment' oddly not developed in the work; a small and wonderful idea in which the intelligent spirit of Deep Ecology and Spinoza join.

Closer reading

Deep Ecology, which emerged in Scandinavia in the early 1970's contrasts itself to the 'shallow ecology movement', a green movement focused on the health of the environment and supplies of natural resources, insofar as their demise adversely affects the lives of present and future humans. Shallow ecology does nothing to unseat human interests and needs from the top of the heap: it merely attends to how conservation of nature is required in order to serve those better. Western ethical frameworks adapted for environmental ethics seem to preserve such a pecking order. Deep Ecology, in sharp contrast, "endorses 'biocentric egalitarianism', the view that all living things are alike in having value ['intrinsic value'] in their own right, independent of their usefulness to human purposes … . Furthermore, deep ecology also endorses what [Arne] Naess calls the 'relational, total-field image', understanding organisms as 'knots' in the biospherical net, the identities of which are defined in terms of their ecological relations to each other." (Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy) Rather than articulate an axiological ethics, Deep Ecologists insist that it is the change in perception of self availed by direct, respectful engagement with the natural world, from bounded, distinct and superior to embedded and among-others, which serves as the solid platform for any subsequent ethics concerned for the environment: Christian, utilitarian, Buddhism, Kantian or otherwise.

De Jonge's first chapter, "Deep Ecology and Environmental Ethics", challenges the distinctions claimed by deep ecologists that it alone is not an anthropocentric 'ethics of nature'. De Jonge shows convincingly how these two key concepts -- intrinsic value and biocentric egalitarianism -- are of a piece with, not radical departures from, those 'shallower' frameworks. Examining Deep Ecology's chief normative principles -- biocentric egalitarianism and ecological holism -- de Jonge argues that there's an incoherence afoot, specifically that "deep ecologists aim to shift the focus from morally considering individuals to considering the whole, to the relationships that obtain between species rather than to individuals themselves, but at the same time hold us morally responsible for the domination of nature" (29). Seeking another avenue for deep ecology to 'challenge environmental ethics and to break away from [these] controversies" (30), de Jonge turns to the 'heart' of Deep Ecology, the development of ecological self and ecological conscience.

The second chapter, "Self-Realization: the Heart of Deep Ecology", assesses (primarily) Warwick Fox's "deep questioning-of-self" project. This project, in terms not unlike those of transpersonal psychology (44-47), posits the work of making care(ful) relations between human and all else, as the work of moving from a destructive and idiotic version of self ("narrow self") to wider identification with all beings, to a recognition of one's (not necessarily greater or more crucial) part in a greater whole. This psychological angle is a rich response to the shortcomings, especially motivational, of axiological rationalist ethics. As David Hume pointed out, axioms like 'thou shalt not kill' simply do not work terrifically well if someone has already decided to kill or, has an inclination toward killing due to their emotional range, their intimate experience and their local understanding of reality. Deep Ecology is deep insofar as it attempts to work at these levels, at the formation of fundamental beliefs and perceptions and feelings about non-human nature. As Arne Naess, the epicenter of the Deep Ecology movement, insisted: '[E]thics follows from how we experience the world', hence the work of challenging and changing how we experience the world, including our selves is the route to 'mature human development'. In the case of Deep Ecology, that 'mature development' is a view of selves-in-larger-biotic connectivity.

Despite finding these strengths, de Jonge is also highly critical here, pressing Deep Ecology hard to explain exactly how it can, on the one hand, promote an Atman-esque greater self (drawn from Vedic thought) as our proper and mature end, while still retaining what seems to be a (non-Vedic) 'working base' of centric human-aware selfhood within that self-dissolving whole. This disjunction is perhaps solved by a Spinozist metaphysics (not a self-in-whole system at all), but a Spinozist metaphysics does not seem to be what Deep Ecologists actually have in mind when they reiterate the unbounded radically green democratic eco-self project. Relatedly, de Jonge strongly rejects reaching for, and making use of a concept of self which fails to align with how most people tend to value, to think, to act; that is, with partial local attachments for, and lifelong quest for (mostly) human closeness that forms the core of our human lives. This fact about us is ridiculed by ur-identification cosmological consciousness. It might be begging the question slightly, especially for already enlightened beings, but the point is still a good one for the rest of us who confess to having strong preferences for some of our own kind, and good reasons for them. There is often a palpable misanthropy and elitism swirling around Deep Ecology, theorists and activists alike.

Taken as a whole, though, the first section weakens the force of its own critique of Deep Ecology by failing to adequately conceive (at the intellectual and affective levels) the nature of the Deep Ecology project. It begs the question repeatedly. Whatever Deep Ecology is, to mark it as inadequate with the very same tools (concepts, adjudication criteria and even forms of thinking, logics) which it has already argued are of a piece with the apparatus which is responsible for the environmental demise, (say, rationalism) is simply to fail to engage the project properly on its own terms. By analogy consider this: We cannot simply respond to Adorno's statement 'there could be no poetry after Auschwitz' with the same tools he indicted as responsible for conceptually underwriting the Holocaust. In that famous essay, Adorno blamed a form of thinking -- abstract universalism -- for having a hand in sending Jews and queers and mental patients to the gas showers. He argued that it was precisely by virtue of thinking of fellow humans through the lens of the universal that enabled moral inattention to the irreplaceable, non-fungible singularity of those who were exterminated. To use the language and the logic of universal humanism to respond to Adorno would be to have not heard what he said, or to reveal that one doesn't take what he has to say seriously. Similar things often happen here in de Jonge's response to Deep Ecology. For instance, trying to smash the idea of intrinsic worth against the concept of biocentric egalitarianism, de Jonge draws us into a 'spiral of absurdity', whereby we would, according to deep ecology, be required to weigh the life of the plasmodium parasite (malaria-carrier) and its right to self-defense, against the 'intrinsic value of human beings' (21). Clearly absurd, is what de Jongy is announcing. Many more ridiculing weighings ensue; e.g., " an insect whose benefit to us is nil" versus "letting people starve". It is as if the author has simply not noticed or refuses to take seriously the deeper Deep Ecology critique, which is that this form of thinking -- the presumption that living species and bits can be boundaried, calibrated, and then placed into intelligible and complete ranking series (and, by us) -- is one of the vehicles which has had a hand in the damage that Deep Ecology is trying to respond to. The mosquito and its inherent worth is not really the main event. To write as if it were, is to miss the deeper point entirely.

Now, admittedly it is very difficult to know how to come top terms with such critiques as Adorno's and Deep Ecology's without committing crimes of discursive etiquette. Yet even saying as much would have been good. Deep Ecology's kind of questioning is deep, is radical. One has to grapple with and come to terms with that rather than run roughshod over it all by responding to it with what it puts into question. Warwick Fox, in his autobiographical sketch of Naess, said that he "demonstrates a stance toward the world that is consistently open, playful, inquiring, supportive, and generous in spirit. And that kind of consistency is tremendously impressive. None of this is to say that Naess does not oppose certain things, but it is to say that in situations of conflict, including ecological conflict, Naess is as open to, cheerful with, interested in, supportive of, and generous to those whose views he is attempting to change as the circumstances will allow." (The Trumpeter 1992). The same can't quite be said for de Jonge's response to Naess's thought.

The second half of the book, "Spinoza", is fabulous. It suffers not at all from any misunderstanding of Spinoza's projects. In fact, it is consistently adept at explaining and fleshing out the most difficult Spinozistic terrain: conatus, substance, active and passive power. Anyone looking for good secondary material on Spinoza can add Chapters 3 and 4, "The Metaphysics of Nature" and "Spinoza and Deep Ecology" (esp. the section, "The Metaphysics of Love") to her reading list. Very impressive for a newly-minted scholar. This section serves well the on-going debate in environmental philosophy as to the appropriateness of Spinoza as mascot.

A Concern and an Unfinished Thought

The green question we left off with last chapter was 'how can the concern we show toward those who are closest to us (including self-care) be developed to include all beings?' In the last chapter, "The Social and Political Self", de Jonge backs into the inverse concern, speaking to the phenomenon of those who are unable to develop such deeper concern, a love for and embrace of all beings (including self-love). "A sense of self-importance and egoism is necessary for our survival"(114). Following Spinoza on the value and necessity of understanding at the level of experience, understanding the self as good is a base upon which all further understanding and further concern is built. What we are apparently going to learn here, then, is not just what the Spinozist story is on failure to persevere in one's mode, but how blocked or corrupted mechanisms of perseverance tell us what kind of social and cultural milieu is required in order to enable and sustain all in their self-realization. This steadies the platform from which the green or all-is-me 'understanding embrace' of non-human nature is then possible. De Jonge chooses the 'auto-annihilator' as exemplary of this disabled life, and we think through, with the help of Spinozist principles, the phenomenon of suicide. Pleasure and pain are not 'both natural' nor are they equal and opposite phenomena: pain is external. This adequate idea, however, can be corrupted, can be made into an inadequate one: the false idea that pain is caused by me and a manifestation of my not being worthy. "I am bad". This is especially true of child sexual abuse which damages the body as much as the mind. The child (often a girl-child sexually used by, in 97% of cases, a male family member) develops inadequate ideas regarding her own nature, regarding trust and pain, thereafter "forming an adequate idea of love would seem impossible to realize." If the work of endeavoring to persevere in one's existence through higher levels of understanding -- ultimately headed toward oneness with all other modes of God; Nature's infinite variations intuited as of one's essence -- begins in experience, with learning from and through experience to question one's ideas, then it is clear that suicide is often the final playing out of a life in which that capacity (to put oneself into question) has been corrupted by those very types of experiences which block or steal one's persevering in one's being, or conatus. In addition to mental and physical injury, there is the epistemic fact that if such false ideas are never corrected by those who can do so (those who knew of the abuse but never could speak it out loud, bear witness), then one's conatus is tragically unable to be repatriated. This locates a crucial site of responsibility, and it's fundamentally Spinozist: not a failure of the individual's will to resist harm, but a failure of knowing and accounting for ideas which emerge in one as a result of that harm. To enable a culture where harm of such proportions is not prevented in the first place, and is extended by secrecy and toleration of secrecy in the second, is to cultivate the impossibility of her ever questioning the (false) idea which has become (literally) sown in her. The work of turning false ideas into true ones is the work of putting a person on the path toward her life. It is the ethical.

Deep Ecologists, drawing on Spinoza's ethics, insist that only the right ideas (killing is wrong, adultery is wrong, waste and eco-vandalism are wrong) serve to prevent their occurrence in action. Understanding is the work of fully ethical beings, but that work cannot be undertaken or sustained by those who have been badly damaged, lied to, and lied about. Suicide and ecocide are the results of something very real: realities which we (not 'they', not abused children and not pandas) failed to prevent in and through our widespread failure to question false and damaging ideas and their correlate cultural practices. De Jonge ends this important section with these statements: "The attainment of freedom starts from conceiving a character greater than one's own, which Spinoza believes all of us can conceive." (117). In the case of those beings that 'cannot conceive a character greater than their own there is clearly a mandate for protection of the innocent and the ignorant' (117). Notice that this group will include two subgroups: those unable to conceive of their perseverance by nature (trilliums?) and those unable to do so by virtue of having suffered damage and disenfranchisement (slaughterhouse-raised chicken?). Having interests as the criterion for moral subjectivity falls away as the central ethical concern. Those unable to conceive of their own interests -- however that incapacity is furnished -- fall under an umbrella of moral concern. We are obliged to protect the vulnerable, not merely by acting in a certain way but by understanding them in a different way. This includes ourselves. But also bulllfrogs and cod and trilliums and the Appalachian highlands and the blue whale, 'knots of life' which are, and have been, continuously and for eons, divested of their capacity to persevere in their own modes of being by harmful forces external to them. Living beings in these sorts of conditions internalize conceptions of themselves which dead-end their innate vitality, their conatus. It's what we call depression but under a wider description. Battery hens perhaps don't commit suicide but they do cut and act out. Think of the zombie Big Cats pacing at the zoo fence. Whether and how these other modes of 'God or Nature' have self-understanding, or are prevented in achieving a greater degree of self-realization in and through erroneous ideas ("Tigers are good to look at") and false practices ("Many hens of same size makes efficient chicken packaging!") would be the right sorts of questions. So much could be done by de Jonge by way of this linkage with the discussion of suicide, but oddly, the link is not made.