Spinoza and Medieval Jewish Philosophy

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Steven Nadler (ed.), Spinoza and Medieval Jewish Philosophy, Cambridge University Press, 2014, 239pp., $95.99 (hbk) ISBN 9781107037861.


Reviewed by Daniel Frank, Purdue University


The connective 'and' in the title of this collection does considerable work. It serves to bridge Spinoza with his predecessors in Jewish philosophy in a variety of ways, both comparative and more directly chronological. For some decades now, commencing with Warren Zev Harvey's classic 1981 article, "A Portrait of Spinoza as a Maimonidean",[1] there has been much work done on tracing Spinoza's philosophical lineage beyond that of so-called "continental rationalism". The lens is wider than that. More and more we see Spinoza as indebted (malgré lui) to Maimonides and Gersonides no less than to Descartes and Hobbes. And such indebtedness, carrying in its train a salutary muddying of the historiographical story we tell our students, allows us to see Spinoza as really a Janus-faced figure, much as Harry Wolfson discerned. Spinoza may well be seen as both the last of the medievals and the first of the moderns. We usually give the foundational prize for 'father of modern philosophy' to Descartes, but if we change, perhaps not unreasonably, the regnant criterion from epistemology to political philosophy and philosophical theology, we may begin to pause. Hobbes begins to loom very large from this angle, but even he signaled the radicality of Spinoza, when, upon reading Spinoza's Tractatus Theologico-Politicus (1670), he uttered that he (Hobbes himself) "durst not write so boldly." In sum, Spinoza is more than a critic of Cartesian dualism; he is also a critic of medieval religious philosophy generally. And from this latter vantage point he, not Descartes, may be seen as the culmination of one epoch and, by virtue of his radicality, the commencing of something new.

Steven Nadler has assembled a strong set of essays here. Topics covered include philosophical psychology, metaphysics, textual hermeneutics, moral psychology, philosophy of action, and ethics. Essays divide between those that are comparative in nature, eschewing the Wolfsonian hunt for medieval sources for one or another Spinozistic position (T. M. Rudavsky, Warren Zev Harvey, Kenneth Seeskin, Nadler), and essays that tend to go in for such detective work (Jacob Adler, Julie Klein, Yitzhak Melamed). Overarching the particulars of the scholarship is the revisionist nature of the project, and by this I mean the way Spinoza is used in some cases to revise certain views of his predecessors. So, this volume does not just allow one to see Spinoza in a new way by contextualizing him against his medieval Jewish forebears; it also allows us to see those predecessors themselves in new ways by reference to Spinoza. For example, by virtue of his reading of Spinoza, Charles Manekin revises our understanding of Crescas' determinism. According to Manekin, Crescas' determinism, itself lodged as a critique of Maimonidean libertarianism, is really no different, no weaker than Spinoza's strict necessitarianism. What should be highlighted in this way of proceeding is the way that the history of philosophy proceeds bi-directionally. The arrow of time runs both backwards and forwards. Crescas' determinism is clarified by seeing how it plays itself out in Spinoza's necessitarianism. This is not, or need not be, anachronistic. In fact, only if we think that history is reactive, responsive only to the past, can we imagine that ideas are not pregnant with possibility. Someday I would like to write a Harvey-inspired essay titled "A Portrait of Maimonides as a Spinozist". Prima facie such an essay would indicate a Straussian disposition, hinting that Maimonides closeted certain irreligiosities. But nothing could be farther from the truth. Rather, the essay would point to the depth of commitment to philosophical speculation for a thinker ensconced in the rabbinic tradition. It would tease out the extent to which one may reasonably speak of Maimonidean "naturalism", without offending against theism.

As noted, essays in the collection range from comparative studies to chronological source studies. Adler traces the influence of Alexander of Aphrodisias on Spinoza's view of the mortality of the soul. Klein identifies Gersonides as an important source for Spinoza's understanding of the eternity of the mind. The final essay in the volume by Melamed presents a philosophical trialogue between Maimonides, Crescas, and Spinoza on the possibility of an infinite series. The trialogue showcases Crescas as both a critic of Maimonides and an important source for Spinoza's own view on the infinite and divine attributes. The essays are attentive to detail and allow the historian to position Spinoza against the backdrop of issues that gripped thinkers for centuries before him.

Amongst those essays that are more comparative in scope are those by Rudavsky, Harvey, Seeskin, and Nadler. Rudavsky compares Ibn Ezra and Spinoza on biblical hermeneutics, and helpfully reminds us that Spinoza is the not the first to apply rigorous critical and scientific categories to Holy Writ. Harvey brings Maimonides and Spinoza together on the issue of the love of God. Spinoza's celebrated amor Dei intellectualis is fleshed out by reference to both Arabic and Judeo-Arabic sources. I especially benefited from musing on the essays of Seeskin, Heidi Ravven, and Nadler. Seeskin fruitfully compares Maimonides and Spinoza on humility. For Maimonides, humility is the crown of the virtues, not just in direct contrast to Aristotelian magnanimity, but also in contrast to Spinoza's evaluation of it. For Spinoza, as for Nietzsche later, humility is a vice, indicative of an irrational small-mindedness. This essay is not an exercise in philosophical Quellenforschung. Rather, Seeskin is intent on teasing out the interesting anthropological implications that emerge from Maimonides' and Spinoza's respective anti-anthropomorphisms concerning God. In her essay Ravven addresses an issue in moral psychology, namely the deep connection that both Maimonides and Spinoza see between knowledge of God and moral motivation. The more we understand God and study nature, the more we as moral agents are motivated by that very understanding. In effect, Ravven is pointing to a shared 'internalist' commitment by both philosophers. For both, knowledge of God has practical implications, and the more we as embodiments and vehicles of human agency transcend our particularity, the greater is the possibility to act in optimal ways.

Ravven's essay sets the stage, I think, for Nadler's very fine piece on moral luck and human (in)vulnerability in Maimonides, Gersonides, and Spinoza. It's a classic topic as old as the Greeks and as recent as Williams's and Nagel's important papers. Nadler is clear about a Stoic resonance in the discussion on moral luck in the philosophers he presents, and this is hardly surprising in Spinoza's case. But to discern a Stoic (and Socratic) resonance in Maimonides and Gersonides, that is, to see knowledge as sufficient for virtue and virtue as sufficient for happiness and invulnerability to fortune, may seem a stretch. On the contrary, however, I think Nadler is quite right to press on this, and his Maimonidean gloss on Job's fate as very much due to Job's own lack of understanding seems just right.

The single essay in the volume that I have some misgivings about is Steven Frankel's on Spinoza's critique of Maimonides. For sure, Spinoza is a critic of Maimonides, but how should this be understood? Clearly Spinoza holds, contra Maimonides, that there is an unbridgeable gulf between philosophy and religious faith (TTP 14), but what are the political implications of this incommensurability for Spinoza? For Frankel, the dichotomy splits the state in two, and the Spinozistic gulf between philosophy and religion "alludes to the unbridgeable chasm between philosophy and religion or politics" (94). It is true that Maimonides understands religion (the law) as amenable to reason and philosophical speculation, and there is no doubt that Spinoza critiques this along with its Farabian-mediated political Platonism, committed as it is to an enlightenment of the masses. But it is not clear to me that Spinoza's critique here has the political implication that Frankel sees. The Spinozistic critique of Maimonidean Platonism is not a critique of the possibility of any kind of rational politics. Pace Frankel, Spinoza does not take politics and political life to be by its nature irrational. The political realm (the state) is not the cave, and Spinoza's brief on behalf of democracy is key to seeing this point. Spinoza is deeply committed to participatory democracy, the contesting of ideas by all citizens. His universal religion is just that, a baseline applicable to all. Spinoza is dead serious when he declares that "the purpose of the state is freedom" (TTP 20/241), and such freedom is a positive freedom for citizens "to develop in their own ways" (ibid.). In sum, Spinoza's anti-Maimonideanism is not an argument in favor of superstition and crowd control. In its own way, Spinoza's politics is as potentially transformative as that of his predecessor.

This is a solid collection of essays. It is as important for what it forces one to understand about how to do philosophy in a historically interesting and revisionist way, as it is in presenting Spinoza both as a spoiler of what preceded him and as a foundational figure for what followed in his train.

[1] Journal of the History of Philosophy 19: 151-172.