Spinoza and the Politics of Renaturalization

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Hasana Sharp, Spinoza and the Politics of Renaturalization, University of Chicago Press, 2011, 242pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226750743.

Reviewed by Michael Mack, Durham University


Spinoza's philosophy becomes increasingly relevant for a critique and revision of traditional humanism. The term humanism describes the attempt to elevate human life over and above that of the merely natural. On this view nature names a lack (hence the expression 'merely natural'): it lacks rationality which distinguishes humanity. A divide between the natural and the human characterizes the concept of humanism. In this sense humanism concurs with the philosophical school of compatibilism which assumes that the contingent and merely natural aspect of our existence is compatible with being ruled by its opposite: the adjudicating and governmental human mind. Most contemporary philosophers adhere to a compatibilist view of humanity. This is the point of departure for Hasana Sharp's intriguing book about Spinoza's contemporary relevance for the following fields of inquiry: post-humanism, feminism, ecological thought and political philosophy.

The starting premise of this brilliant book is that Spinoza's thought diverges from philosophies (those of Kant and Descartes) which posit a compatibility of our naturalist tendencies with a rationalist ideal of subduing and controlling natural urges, feelings and inconsistencies. By departing from compatibilism Spinoza is at odds with most philosophers who have come after Descartes and Kant. As Sharp points out, "most philosophers today maintain a 'compatibilist' idea of the person, a view of moral agency in which freedom of the will is seen to be compatible with natural determination" (p. 2). The view that we can exert our rational free will despite natural determinations holds sway in social thought and thus exerts a strong influence on politics.

For there to be compatibility between two disconnected entities there needs to be some form of a divide between them in the first place. As I have shown in Spinoza and the Specters of Modernity, Spinoza radically outdoes the duality between nature and reason (or free will). There is continuity rather than a duality between affect and concept, between desire and thought, between reason and nature. Building on Spinoza's thought, Sharp attempts to counter our current form of politics with a new one of "renaturalization". What does this mean for our understanding of humanity and its social habitat, politics? Sharp argues that Spinoza at once questions the grandeur with which traditional humanism endows the term 'humanity' and re-enforces the value of human life in its diversity. Spinoza "redefines human agency as entirely natural, locating it within a system that reserves no special status whatsoever for humans" (p. 4). This devaluation of the eminence of humanity within the larger context of nature of which we are only a tiny part does, however, help alleviate human suffering.

From Spinoza's perspective violence, hierarchy, humiliation and warfare are the result of the human presumption to triumph over the lowly sphere of the merely natural, of 'mere life'. The "denial of human exceptionalism serves, first and foremost, to attenuate a particular destructive passion: hatred, directed at oneself and others" (p.4). Spinoza at once undermines traditional humanism and revaluates it in philanthropic terms. Spinoza takes issue with what he takes to be the supernaturalism of humanism. This may sound incongruous. Does not humanism reject the supernatural? Spinoza argues, however, that the very attempt to distinguish itself from nature risks turning humanity into a supernatural entity.

Traditional humanism posits a compatibility between two distinct spheres: human freedom within the determined but not determining context of nature from which humanity separates itself. This rise above nature endows humanity with supernatural powers: "Even if humanism typically rejects a supernatural order in favour of human community on earth, from the perspective of Spinozism it relocates supernaturalism within the human mind" (p. 5). The human mind thinks itself above the sphere of the merely natural. Other members of the human community can become placeholders of the merely natural too. If this happens, we witness the ideational formulation and the political perpetuation of religious, racist, economic and other forms of hatred. The author shows how misanthropic forms of ecological thought perpetuate what Spinoza critiques as anthropocentricism: ecologists who attribute higher value to non-human nature are as much bound to a moralist notion of perfection as traditional humanists who impose a transcendent standard of perfect moral conduct on us which we can never attain.

The author provides a fascinating analysis of the relevance of Spinoza's thought to feminism, in particular to that of the more Hegelian bent of Judith Butler and the Nietzschean approach of Elisabeth Grosz. Sharp brings to the fore how Butler combines Hegel's and Spinoza's philosophies, while still clinging to a Hegelian philosophy of recognition. Butler's Hegelianism is one that is inclusive of otherness because it is revisable. Butler reconstructs Hegel's philosophy along Spinozist lines. This makes her reading of both Hegel and Spinoza highly creative. Butler opens up Hegel's humanism to Spinoza's posthumanism.

As Sharp clearly shows, the most striking difference between Hegel and Spinoza is, however, their different approach to representation. Hegel's philosophy of recognition is premised on the act of representation: we are vying for social recognition via the way we represent ourselves. The more elevated from the lowly sphere of the merely natural our representations are, the more we hope to receive social esteem for our rational-moral capabilities which enable us to overcome the sphere of affective inclinations.

For Spinoza, by contrast, the term affect embraces not only the emotive but also the active and rational aspects of our lives. His conatus establishes the continuity between concept and emotion, between mind and body. Spinoza levels the playing field: as I have argued in Spinoza and the Specters of Modernity, his vision is radically non-hierarchical. Sharp astutely analyzes how Spinoza's posthumanism is as much concerned with keeping an even keel regarding elevation toward the supernatural as he is careful not to establish a natural norm which could be used as a means to measure and streamline human diversity: "Human was, for Spinoza, a rallying call to oppose sectarian conflict and deny that some peoples are favoured above all others by God" (p. 218), and equally, "Spinoza's words on beast suggest that we ought to be wary of any reactionary antihumanism that may animate our turn away from the human" (p. 219). Sharp points out that the sentimental approach toward animals in the style of Montaigne or the idealization of nature (Rousseau) may evidence misanthropy.

She argues that "misanthropy is easily observed in the ecological movement, for example" (p. 219). Spinoza avoids the Scylla of humanism and the Charybdis of antihumanism. Humanism causes hatred of others by holding out the ideal of a quasi-supernatural norm which we cannot meet and antihumanism demotes our specific human needs and inclinations by extolling those of non-human animals. In both cases Spinoza critiques the way we structure our lives and thoughts along the theological-literary method of representation:

The intellectual love of God does not follow from mutually satisfying correspondence of representations between two structurally identical beings; it is not a relationship of recognition. God does not seek a satisfying portrait of singular beings. The divine intellect always already contains ideas of every existing thing. Humans never arrive at a comprehensive representation of God, or nature as a totality. (p. 147)

By undermining methodologies of representation, Spinoza has led the groundwork for a new conception of literature. This new understanding of literature revises our approach towards politics. It is no longer a politics of recognition.

Is it one of renaturalization, as Shark has persuasively argued? Sharp carefully hedges her arguments. This is a wise move, because the word nature has all too often been abused as normative device, laying down rules as to how women or men should "naturally" behave. Judith Butler has analyzed how "nature" is culturally constructed. And yet we live in a substantive, embodied world of nature. The point is not to conflate the natural with the cultural. The study of representation is of huge socio-political value, because it reveals how, in different contexts, the cultural becomes represented as the natural. A politics based on representation and recognition does not, however, do justice to our diversity. Instead of representation, Spinoza's conatus evokes the diverse and idiosyncratic forces of creativity and self-determination.