Spinoza and the Stoics: Power, Politics and the Passions

Placeholder book cover

Firmin DeBrabander, Spinoza and the Stoics: Power, Politics and the Passions, Continuum, 2007, 149pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780826493934.
University of Utrecht

Reviewed by Theo Verbeek, University of Utrecht


Although the link between Spinoza and Stoicism has been explored to a certain extent by authors like Wolfson (The Philosophy of Spinoza, 1934), Lagrée ('Spinoza et le vocabulaire stoïcien.' in: Totaro, ed., Spinoza: Ricerche di terminologia, 1997) and James ('Spinoza the Stoic.' in: Sorell, ed., The Rise of Modern Philosophy, 1993), DeBrabander's is the first book-length study. As such it cannot be valued too highly. The book can be separated into two halves: one (chapters 1-3) dealing with moral issues, and the other (chapters 4-5) dealing with political questions. His final chapter has little to do with the relation to Stoicism, containing a discussion of Strauss' interpretation of Spinoza. In fact, chapters 5 ('Reason of State') and 6 ('The Philosopher in the State') can be read as independent essays on Spinoza's social and political philosophy. However, the book also raises questions.

Greek Stoic philosophy (as opposed to that of the Imperial period) must be reconstructed. Unfortunately Spinoza never specifies his sources, even though these must have been specific (see the enigmatic references in the preface to Part 5 of the Ethics (Gebhardt II, 277) and in the Improvement of the Intellect (Bruder §74; Gebhardt II, 28)). DeBrabander uses as his guide the collection of Long and Sedley (The Hellenistic Philosophers, vol. I, Cambridge 1987), which he completes with ancient sources, including Diogenes Laërtius, and Cicero. Rather surprisingly, Lipsius (1547-1606), whose Physiologia Stoicorum and Manuductio (both 1604) were much the 17th century equivalents of Long and Sedley, is used sporadically (pp. 73-74; p. 78) -- and not Physiologia or Manuductio but Politica and De constantia. The question is not unimportant given the fact that DeBrabander admits there are also significant differences between Spinoza and the Stoics.

Although DeBrabander does not close his eyes to these differences he often uses Stoicism as a hermeneutical tool. Thus, for example, he believes that the very fact that Spinoza seeks a metaphysical foundation for his moral philosophy can be explained in this way: 'Spinoza […] presents his Ethics as a perfectionist morality, not so much because it ultimately illuminates a path to perfect, unassailable happiness -- which it declines to do -- but rather because it embraces the presuppositions of the Stoic model' (p. 9). And a few lines further on: 'it [Spinoza's inclusion of a discussion of God and the universe] reveals a penchant for philosophical systematization that is highly reminiscent of and, I believe, likely inspired by the Stoics' (p. 9). However 'the Stoics maintain that all events and things are determined teleologically' (p. 11), whereas DeBrabander admits that Spinoza rejects teleology. Moreover, their teleological conception of nature also provides the metaphysical basis for the Stoics' moral philosophy, which claims that moral virtue consists in following the law of nature, that is, basically, in internalizing the telos or reason of nature as a whole -- it is this version of moral perfectionism that made Stoic philosophy attractive to early modern theorists of natural law like Grotius (1583-1645). Spinoza in turn rejects the Grotian conception of natural law (TP ii, 4; TTP xvi, 2; Gebhardt III, 189-90) and, as DeBrabander eventually admits (pp. 47-48), is not a moral perfectionist either. But then it is no longer clear why Spinoza should be indebted to the Stoics for his metaphysics. Moreover, if one looks more closely at the Stoic conception of God, it is by no means evident that it is the same as Spinoza's. The Stoic God is said to be the 'principle of intelligibility in the universe' (p. 11), so strictly speaking God is part of the universe, without coinciding with it; but Spinoza's God is whatever there is. Besides, many other aspects of Spinoza's metaphysics have nothing to do with Stoicism; for example, the bizarre, and apparently irrelevant, layers (immediately infinite modes and mediately infinite modes) placed between God and the finite modes.

Naturally, the denial of teleology also affects Spinoza's moral philosophy. Although, according to DeBrabander, Spinoza shares with the Stoics his idea of virtue as cognitive therapy (with which I agree), he ultimately denies that Spinoza is a moral perfectionist, on the ground that according to Spinoza moral perfection is impossible (pp. 47-8). This is a problematic claim, given the fact that Spinoza does speak the language of moral perfectionism. In the TTP, for example, he encourages his readers to cultivate their intellect because it is the best part of their being (TTP iv, 4); the main claim of the Short Treatise is that the only way to overcome the 'evil passions' is by cultivating our intellect (verstand). Apparently DeBrabander identifies reason (ratio) and intellect (intellectus) or at least assumes that there is a smooth transition between the two (see, for example, pp. 15, 29, 30, and especially 33). This is problematic. This much is clear, there is a sharp distinction between reason and the intellect in the Short Treatise and the Treatise on the Improvement of the Intellect, whereas in the Ethics, in which the theory of the third kind of knowledge figures as an afterthought (Part V being written much later than the rest), the relation between these two kinds of knowledge is obscure, to say the least -- indeed, one wonders whether Spinoza can really accommodate the intellect. In any case, the intellect lays the ground for what Spinoza calls 'intellectual love of God,' which in turn makes it possible to be perfectly virtuous, virtue being the free gift, so to speak, of love of God. On these points, therefore, Spinoza is much closer to the Stoic (or Neo-Platonic) position than DeBrabander believes (he takes much of it back, though, in his conclusion, p. 127).

This affects his further treatment of moral and political issues. According to DeBrabander Spinoza's denial of perfectionism as well as his denial of individuality lead him to adopt a social version of virtue and ultimately to embrace a political or quasi-political interpretation of wisdom. I would say that on these points Spinoza is profoundly ambiguous. One can agree with DeBrabander that, insofar as man is part of nature, there is little that distinguishes him from other natural beings (p. 11). All finite beings are 'equal' -- indeed, that is one of the grounds of Spinoza's denial of the existence of natural law and natural right as something exclusively human. DeBrabander claims that individualism is undermined even further in Part 5 of the Ethics (p. 49). In a way that is right: love as it is understood in that part of the work (it is different in Part 3) is almost a form of identity with the loved object (as it is in the Short Treatise). On the other hand it is presented as the fulfilment of our own being, even to the point of giving us a form of immortality. Again, this is difficult to understand anyway and there is much reason to question Spinoza's efforts. Still, the explicit way in which Spinoza differentiates human law, positive law, and divine law, as the injunction to cultivate our intellect (TTP IV), suggests that wisdom is relatively independent from the political realm. Although Spinoza admits that even the wise should not be averse from political organization, because it protects them against the aggression of other men and of animals, his ideal of wisdom seems to be designed to allow survival even among the horrors of the state of nature. Accordingly, I do not agree with DeBrabander's claim that 'Spinoza's sage must strive to promote his neighbour's salvation, since his own salvation depends on it' (p. 64). To be sure, the wise man will seek to share with as many people as possible the bliss of intellectual love; but one cannot say that his salvation depends on his own success.

The basis of Stoic political philosophy is the idea of man as an essentially social being (pp. 67-69). This means that any form of political organization is essentially rational. On the whole however the relation to politics is problematic: not only should the wise man keep some distance from political action; he is also a citizen of the world rather than of a particular commonwealth (pp. 71-79). DeBrabander claims, rightly I believe, that in a different way Spinoza's relation to the problem of politics is as troubled and ambiguous ('a conflicted view', p. 79) as that of the Stoics. In fact, the comparison with Stoic philosophy becomes less useful and interesting, the more interesting reference being of course Hobbes (pp. 88-90). I select a few points.

According to DeBrabander, who ascribes to Spinoza a version of the social contract theory, 'Spinoza's version of the contract is more coherent and convincing than Hobbes's' (p. 88), because Hobbes' version is psychologically improbable (in the state of nature humans cannot be rational agents) and because Hobbes assumes 'there is a rupture between the state of nature and the civil state' (p. 89). But I wonder whether a social contract can be ascribed to Spinoza at all. Not only is there no mention of it in the Political Treatise; the only mention I find in the Theologico-political Treatise is ambiguous (to say the least) and loaded with difficulties, because Spinoza also believes that there is no natural duty to keep one's promises (TTP xvi, 7). So there is no contract theory or, if there is one at all, it is of very limited application -- which is what DeBrabander seems to believe after all (but in a vague and unsubstantiated way).

On the whole DeBrabander's analysis of Spinoza's philosophy is, I believe, correct, although he tends to underestimate how problematic it really is. Thus, for example, I think that Spinoza's preference for democratic government is much more qualified than DeBrabander seems to think (p. 93). The very fact that Spinoza bases this 'conclusion' on an analysis of the history of Israel should have made him cautious; indeed, it means that democracy demands religious unity, which since the Reformation is lost (apart from the fact that the Christian religion is unsuitable as a basis for political organization -- for a more detailed discussion see my book Spinoza's Theologico-political Treatise, Aldershot: Ashgate, 2003, chap. 5).

On the whole I do not think that DeBrabander makes his overall point that Stoicism is Spinoza's main historic and systematic reference (let alone his only reference) -- if that is his point (although in the end there is much to qualify that point it is certainly the point with which he started). Over the centuries Stoicism has proved to be a very attractive partner for many other traditions, especially Neo-Platonism, and I for one would be inclined to think of Spinoza employing, instead, some Neo-Platonic source. But whatever Spinoza's historical inspiration and sources, the main figures he had to deal with were his contemporaries Descartes and Hobbes, that is, mechanical philosophers, who replaced the vertical scheme of Neo-Platonism with a more horizontal scheme of mechanical causes. To stress either of them at the expense of the other is to provide a distorted view of Spinoza's philosophy, which I believe is much less coherent and unified than most people seem to think. In fact, it looks as if Spinoza did not really manage to accommodate these two completely different intellectual factors (Platonism and/or Stoicism on one hand and mechanical philosophy on the other). Still, despite my disagreements (which may be inevitable given the very nature of Spinoza's philosophy) this is an interesting and stimulating book, and one any student of Spinoza should read.