Spinoza on Human Freedom: Reason, Autonomy and the Good Life

Placeholder book cover

Matthew J. Kisner, Spinoza on Human Freedom: Reason, Autonomy and the Good Life, Cambridge University Press, 2011, 261pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521198882.

Reviewed by Justin Steinberg, Brooklyn College, CUNY


Spinoza's Ethics opens with such a heady and original metaphysics that critics and scholars often get ensnared in the rich tangle of questions raised in Parts I and II. Indeed, so much scholarly attention has been lavished on Spinoza's metaphysics that it is easy to forget what the title of Spinoza's magnum opus so clearly announces: this is a work of ethical philosophy. Matthew Kisner's new book, Spinoza on Human Freedom, helps to correct this pattern of neglect. He draws not only on the Ethics but also on Spinoza's early treatises and later political writings to sketch a compelling portrait of Spinoza as a formidable ethical philosopher whose chief concern, across his corpus, is with human liberation. Kisner succeeds in bringing into full relief the complexity of Spinoza's view of moral agency, in which the agent cannot simply depend on reason to quell the passions or to dictate how to act, but must rely on the imagination and the passions to make dynamic, situated practical judgments.

The first several chapters focus on freedom, which is the norm that guides Spinoza's practical philosophy. Some of what Spinoza has to say about freedom in general seems to render human freedom impossible. Take, for instance, his notorious definition of freedom in the Ethics: "that thing is said to be free which exists solely from the necessity of its own nature, and is determined to action by itself alone" (EID7). In Spinoza's terms, freedom requires that a thing be a fully adequate cause of its effect (EIIID1). But even though these formulations seem to preclude human freedom, Spinoza consistently maintains that humans can be free, or adequate, causes.

Kisner attempts to square this circle (Chapter 1) by distinguishing between different senses of freedom. Absolute freedom, defined in EID7, applies only to God. Finite things can obtain only a degree of freedom. And when "degree freedom" sufficiently approximates absolute freedom -- crossing some undefined, and perhaps indeterminate, threshold -- we may abandon "degree" language and refer to it simply as human freedom, full stop. Kisner offers a parallel account of adequate causation and adequate ideas: while human ideas cannot be fully adequate, they can be sufficiently adequate to "single them out as attaining some special, epistemic standard" (42).

While Kisner's three-fold account of freedom strikes me as relatively plausible, I am not convinced that a parallel three-fold account of adequacy is, as he claims, "necessary to make Spinoza's philosophy consistent" (43). One could certainly argue, against Kisner, that when Spinoza claims that we have adequate ideas (IIP38C, IIP47), he means adequate in the full sense of the term -- the only sense that Spinoza articulates. And, when we have adequate ideas, we are the adequate cause of certain effects (see IIID2, IIIP1dem).

Kisner offers several reasons for doubting the possibility of human adequate ideas and adequate causation. For instance, he cites EIVP4 as evidence that humans cannot be adequate causes. But, as far as I can tell, all that this proposition establishes is that it is impossible for humans to be exclusively adequate causes.[1] And this in no way precludes the possibility that humans could be adequate causes of some effects (when we have adequate ideas) and partial causes of others (when we have inadequate ideas). Nor do the other considerations that Kisner adduces provide sufficient warrant for his interpretation. For instance, Kisner claims that "human ideas, since they must represent the finite modes of the body, cannot completely represent the causal antecedents of their object," and so cannot be fully adequate. Even if all human ideas have as their object [objectum] modes of the human body [EIIP13], this does not mean that no part of the content, or ideata, of these ideas can be adequately represented.[2] This is not to say that a univocal reading of adequate ideas and adequate causation is entirely unproblematic. My point is just that the evidence that Kisner offers is not enough to persuade me that Spinoza did not believe in the possibility of fully adequate human ideas and, consequently, fully adequate human causation.

Chapters 2 and 3 help us to see what is attractive about Spinoza's account of freedom. Here Kisner shows that Spinoza's account is not merely an ad hoc attempt to salvage freedom in an inhospitable metaphysics. Rather, it is, on his rendering, a via media between an untenable libertarian indeterminism and a crude, Hobbesian compatibilism. While the libertarian approach is incompatible with the principle of sufficient reason, Hobbesian compatibilism does not account for the full range of constraints on liberty, including "internal psychological forces" (53). And, as Kisner effectively shows in Chapter 3, Spinoza's account of autonomy -- which consists in forming adequate ideas, or being substantively rational -- avoids some of the pitfalls of connecting autonomy with merely procedural rationality (60), without leading to a pernicious paternalism (61-63).

After delineating Spinoza's account of freedom and autonomy, Kisner turns to consider how one can become free through the power of practical reason. In Chapter 6, Kisner presents Spinoza as a kind of natural law theorist, for whom the "divine law" or "natural law" of the Tractatus Theologico-Politicus [TTP] and the dictates of reason in the Ethics are bona fide moral laws. Spinoza's natural laws, however, are importantly different from Hobbesian laws of nature in that they are not exclusively instrumentally related to our interests. Take, for instance, the injunction to treat other humans benevolently, which is the focus of Chapter 7. On Kisner's account, this dictate is grounded in the fact that human beings agree in nature. On the basis of this claim, Kisner maintains that benevolent actions are constitutive of one's own good, and thus are good independently of the ultimate consequences.

While I am generally sympathetic to this thesis, Spinoza's non-instrumental argument for benevolence is not without its problems. As Kisner construes it, the argument relies on the following three premises:

(a) if some person, A, acts to preserve herself, then to the extent that she is rational, she will act to preserve her nature;

(b) if A acts to preserve her particular nature in this way, then she also acts to preserve the nature of another, B, with whom her nature agrees;

(c) if A acts to preserve the nature of B, A acts to preserve B (139).

Taken together, premises (a) and (c) seem to rely on the assumption -- let's call it (d) -- that a thing is identical with its nature or essence, without which it is unclear why the preservation of a thing's nature should entail the preservation of any particular thing with that nature, and vice versa. And these premises add up to an argument for benevolence towards other humans only if we assume (e) humans share a nature or essence. The problem is that (d) and (e) are mutually incompatible: if (e) humans share an essence, then there are many things with a single essence, which is contrary to (d) the identity of thing and essence.[3]

While Kisner does not confront this exact conundrum, his responses to other objections indicate how he might try to overcome it. For instance, he denies (d), but argues that "striving to preserve X's being" and "striving to preserve X's nature" mutually entail one another, which licenses (a) and (c). This also allows him to defend (e), which he does by showing that two different things share natures in virtue of sharing some essential properties, but not others. However, at this point (b) starts to look rather implausible, since, on the basis of the conatus doctrine, one would preserve the shared essential properties of other humans only if in fact those shared properties were numerically identical.[4] And Kisner's examples of shared essential properties -- "we all have circulatory systems, similarly constituted brains and so forth" (137) -- indicate that they are not.

Chapters 6 and 7 also raise some general questions about Spinoza's view of reason's prescriptive power. Let's stick with the injunction to be benevolent. However unobjectionable this might be, it is rather vacuous, as it does not adequately specify what types of actions would qualify and when. As Kisner rightly points out, reason seems incapable of supplying any specific guidance:

in order to put this principle into practice, I must consider particular situations to identify opportunities for kindness and what particular actions, gestures and bodily movements would constitute acting with kindness. Consequently, deliberation at this level [i.e., deliberation through reason alone] cannot prescribe any particular action (186).

The problem is endemic to Spinoza's very conception of reason, which cannot apprehend particulars (108-109) and so cannot make circumstance-specific, or person-specific, determinations (121).

To show how practical deliberation can proceed despite the limitations of reason, Kisner helpfully distinguishes between the perspective of reason [PR], which issues only "general practical directives derived from adequate ideas" (196), and the practical perspective [PP], which includes "the deliberative processes by which we decide the particular course of action that best promotes our power" (196). Practical deliberation depends crucially on inadequate ideas, to identify the circumstances in which one stands, and on the passions to supply "feedback for determining whether one has correctly implemented reason's guidance" (192).

This distinction between the PR and the PP figures into Kisner's discussion of the Free Man (Chapter 8). On Kisner's reading, the free man described in propositions at the end of Ethics Part IV is best understood not -- as is commonly assumed -- as constituting the model of human nature described in EIV Preface but rather as a "thought experiment" that "is introduced to help us understand reason's guidance by considering an ideal case" (176). The free man helps us to form a more concrete conception of the PR, without dictating how we imperfect, fallible, and largely passive beings should act.

This distinction between the PR and the PP is also central to Kisner's discussion of Spinoza on impartiality. Reason views things sub specie aeternitatis, and so "judges our good without considering the spatial and temporal perspectives by means of which we distinguish and privilege the concerns of particular individuals, including ourselves" (126). Many have supposed that total impartiality is ethically problematic in part because it would force us to treat as morally irrelevant all personal relationships based on love, care, and friendship. Kisner seems to be sympathetic to this critique, taking to Bernard Williams' famous "one thought too many" example as illustrating "the proper role of partiality in moral deliberation: the man's love for his wife ought to be seen as providing the moral justification for his action, rather than as an extramoral, extraneous concern" (155).[5]

Fortunately, as Kisner sees it, because Spinoza's ethics remains rooted in self-interest, "the fact that one benefits from and loves his wife counts squarely as an ethical concern" (156). Still, lest we accord too much ethical weight to special relations, Kisner is quick to point out that, on Spinoza's account, "we would be better people, in the sense of more powerful and happy, if we were impartial" (156). I take it that Kisner's claim here is that while the best person (i.e., free man) would be impartial, the best thing for the agent in this scenario to do, given the irrational sources of his power, might be to act from partial love.

Here, as elsewhere, Kisner supplies a portrayal of Spinoza as a more moderate ethical philosopher than we are accustomed to. Indeed, one of the avowed main conclusions of the book is that "Spinoza's ethics is better equipped to account for traditional morality than has been appreciated" (5). I wonder, though, whether Spinoza on Human Freedom does not wind up making Spinoza appear more conventional than he actually is. Take, for instance, Kisner's account of moral responsibility in Chapter 3. Here Kisner maintains that, for Spinoza, freedom is not a necessary condition for moral responsibility, so causal determinism does not preclude moral responsibility. But, Spinoza does seem to think that freedom, in his sense of causal power, is a condition for moral responsibility and that one's lack of causal power is exculpatory (see Ep. 78; TP 2/6). And since, on Spinoza's view, evil actions are the product of ignorance and impotence, assignments of blame are never appropriate. While Kisner seems to shy away from this interpretation because it would "involve a fairly radical revision of much conventional morality" (66), Spinoza's willingness to embrace counter-intuitive and unconventional claims is part of what makes him so interesting.

A more formal way in which Kisner attempts to place Spinoza within mainstream moral philosophy is by putting his ethics in dialogue with Kant's (see esp. §6.3, §7.5, and the Conclusion). Twice Kisner notes that, on the issue of autonomy, despite evident and important differences, Spinoza is "far closer to Kant than one might think" (134; cf. 12). And his account of Spinoza's contemporary relevance relies heavily on his claim that Spinoza "defends attractive Kantian intuitions about the ethical significance of autonomy . . . while avoiding some of Kant's more objectionable commitments" (244-5). While I agree with Kisner's claim that "Spinoza's view [of freedom] is worthy of greater attention" (11), I am not convinced that establishing Spinoza's place within the Schneewindian narrative is the most helpful way of appreciating why.

Spinoza on Human Freedom closes on a high note, with a strong chapter that examines how the state can contribute to the freedom or autonomy of the individual. Kisner interprets Spinoza as maintaining that freedom is possible only to the extent that citizens are virtuous and loyal. One crucial way in which civic virtue and loyalty are fostered is through the adoption of democratic institutions (220ff.), which limit forms of domination (223), balance civic interests so that the governors -- wittingly or not -- aim at the interests of the governed (224), and secure broad representation (225). Such institutions promote trust and diminish resentment. Moreover, democracies lead people to develop rational habits, which set one on the path to full rationality (226). The chapter allows Kisner to drive home one of his main claims, namely, that because of our passivity, our freedom depends in important ways on external (socio-political) conditions. He connects Spinoza's account of "relational autonomy" with some recent strands of feminist philosophy -- both recognize the inadequacy of pure proceduralism and the importance of civic relationships for promoting substantive rationality.

Ultimately, Kisner's book fills an important gap in the scholarship. Not only does it provide a much-needed comprehensive, and generally cogent, account of Spinoza as a theorist of freedom and practical reason, it does so in a way that gives the lie to the picture of Spinoza as a ham-handed rationalist for whom moral reasoning consists in simple rational deduction and for whom one's rational capacities exist largely independently from one's social and political conditions. Spinoza on Human Freedom not only reminds us that Spinoza was an ethical philosopher; it reveals what a subtle and fascinating one he was.

[1] The proposition reads: "It is impossible that a man should not be a part of Nature, and that he should be able to undergo no changes except those which can be understood through his own nature alone, and of which he is the adequate cause" (EIVP4).

[2] Even if each idea has as its objectum a mode of body, which one can grasp only confusedly (EIIP28), its ideatum may well be something the cause of which one can represent, thereby satisfying the "causal representation requirement" on adequate ideas. In a letter to Tschirnhaus in January, 1675, Spinoza claims that one can have causal (i.e., adequate) knowledge of a thing whenever one grasps its true definition (Ep. 60).

[3] This argument is stated forcefully in Michael Della Rocca, "Egoism and the Imitation of Affects in Spinoza" in Spinoza on Reason and the 'Free Man': The Jerusalem Conference [vol. 4], eds. Yirmiyahu Yovel and Gideon Segal [New York: Little Room Press, 2004], 123-147.

[4] Diane Steinberg, "Spinoza's Ethical Doctrine and the Unity of Human Nature," Journal of the History of Philosophy 22:3 (1984), pp. 303-324, spells out this problem very effectively and offers a provocative account of how it might be overcome.

[5] I think Kisner slightly misrepresents Williams' point here. As I understand him, Williams is not claiming that this case reveals that one's love of one's wife can be morally justifying; rather, it reveals the limitations of the practice of moral justification. The very thought that one must find a moral reason that would justify preferring saving one's wife to saving a stranger just is the one thought too many.