Spinoza on Learning to Live Together

Spinoza Together

Spinoza on Learning to Live Together, Oxford University Press, 2020, 228pp., $77.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198713074.


Reviewed by Justin Steinberg, Brooklyn College and CUNY Graduate Center


In numerous works spanning several decades, Susan James has made the case for Spinoza’s significance and resourcefulness as a social thinker. Spinoza on Learning to Live Together brings together thirteen of her most recent essays—some new, some previously published—that engage with various aspects of Spinoza’s thought, including his epistemology, psychology, theology, ethics, and political theory.

While these essays explore a range of issues in Spinoza’s philosophy, certain themes recur throughout. One theme is that, despite Spinoza’s apparently disparaging view of the imagination, in fact the imagination is vital to epistemic and moral advancement. Another theme is that individual flourishing depends to a considerable degree on social relations and political institutions. These two themes are in fact intertwined in these essays, as James shows how, for Spinoza, building empowering socio-political communities requires exercising one’s own imagination and affecting the imagination of others in productive ways. Together these themes challenge the widely held, but mistaken, view that for Spinoza human flourishing is best achieved when we are free from external influences. 

To appreciate the significance of James’s interpretation, it is worth considering how Spinoza understands the imagination and why it might seem like he takes a dim view of its place in moral and intellectual life. For Spinoza, a critic of faculty psychology (E2p48s), “the imagination” is just a shorthand way of referring to the imagistic ideas that have their roots in sense perception. Spinoza claims that this imagistic way of knowing things constitutes the first (read: lowest) form of cognition, asserting that it is the “the only cause of falsity” (E2p41) and passivity (E3p1; E3p3). Moreover, he insists that there is no inferential path from what is gained from this kind of cognition to clear and distinct knowledge (E5p28d). Imaginative ideas present things in partial, limited ways, reflecting the limits of our sensory modalities for grasping the essences of things. Worse still, through our idiosyncratic experiences, such ideas become haphazardly associated with other (intrinsically unrelated) imagistic ideas, resulting in a jumbled web of ideas that obscures our ability to grasp things as they are. And, indeed, in his account of prophets in the Theologico-Political Treatise (TTP) , where they  are presented as having unusually vivid powers of imagination, Spinoza asserts that “those who have the most powerful imaginations are less able to grasp things by pure intellect” (TTP 2.1). One might be forgiven, then, for thinking that imaginative ideas are nothing more than impediments to knowledge for Spinoza.

Nevertheless, James makes a persuasive case against this view. In these essays, I think that we find at least four different ways of conceiving of the constructive role of the imagination. First, a well-tempered imagination, as opposed to an unrestrained one, can prime one to apprehend things as they are. We might call this the “preparatory role” of the imagination. Second, the imagination can mimic reason, functioning as a simulacrum of true knowledge (“imitative role”). Third, the imagination helps one to apply the universal principles of reason to particular cases or to specify what falls under such a principle (“specifying role”). Fourth, and finally, the imagination can help to make salient or to otherwise strengthen our commitment to what is true and good (“fortifying role”). In what follows, I will elaborate on James’s case for these epistemic roles, showing how she weaves it all together with an account of the social production of knowledge. 

The preparatory role of the imagination is sketched in the first essay of the volume, “Creating Rational Understanding: Spinoza as a Social Epistemologist.” In this essay James discusses the role of Spinoza’s notion of “true religion” in creating “propitious conditions in which adequate ideas can become available and be used to generate knowledge of the second kind” (21). On James’s rendering, true religion, as opposed to superstition, fosters inquiry by promoting “sincerity and openness” (20), a willingness to subject one’s beliefs to critique, and a general appreciation of the value of social life. Here, as elsewhere, she emphasizes the role of narratives and stories in promoting salutary intellectual and affective habits. James is surely right to maintain that for Spinoza a community practicing a loving and tolerant religion—perhaps modelled on the religious practice of his Collegiant friends—will be epistemically better off than one shackled by fear and stultifying superstition. Still, one might doubt whether this establishes that true religion and philosophy lie on a continuum (24), especially given the rather sharp line that Spinoza seems to draw in the Ethics between inadequate and adequate knowledge (see e.g., E2p41, E5p28). One might think that one who loves her neighbor on the basis of biblical stories and parables alone at best behaves in ways that mimic, but fall short of, genuinely rational love.

James herself discusses such an imitative role of the imagination in “When does Truth Matter?” In this essay, she defends Spinoza’s claim that faith and philosophy govern separate domains where neither is subordinate to the other. On her account, philosophy and faith operate at different levels, suggesting a parallel with Cicero’s distinction between perfect honestum (honorableness) and its mere likeness (35). James argues that “theology and politics” generate “only a simulacrum of the perfect virtue that flows from philosophical understanding” (38). This essay thus seems to offer quite a different, and not obviously reconcilable, account of the epistemic value of true religion from what we find in the first essay. In the former, we are told that true religion and philosophy are continuous, whereas here Spinoza is presented as having a “two-tier” account of moral development, with faith and philosophy operating at different levels (41).

What I am calling the specifying role of the imagination is explored in “Narrative as the Means to Freedom,” where James argues that the universal rules of Spinozistic reason must be “brought within imaginative reach if it is to mold our desires and actions” (72). I take the point to be something like this: while reason exhorts us, for instance, to love others and bind them to us in friendship, knowing how to express love effectively requires an imaginative grasp of others’ beliefs, desires, and values, etc., so as to express concern for them in ways that they will appreciate. A similar claim is advanced in the final essay, “Fortitude: Living in the Light of Our Knowledge,” where James maintains that, for Spinoza, determining how to rationally cooperate with others—that is, learning how to exhibit generositas—requires the cultivation of “imaginative resources,” on the basis of which we can determine how to “cooperate with people whose desires differ from one’s own” (208). In its specifying role, the imagination is a collaborator in practical deliberation, rather than a mere handmaiden to, or imitator of, the intellect.

The specifying role of the imagination is given an explicitly political twist in the essays “Law and Sovereignty in Spinoza’s Politics,” “Democracy and the Good Life,” and “Freedom of Conscience and Civic Peace: Spinoza on Piety.In these essays, James claims that the proper exercise of sovereign power “depends on both imagination and reason” (89) since the sovereign must “employ images or stories that appeal to the situation and temperament of a specific people” (125) and assess what its “subjects can manage” (164) in framing and applying the law. In short, what is politically rational depends on the psychological makeup of the people. One of the reasons that, for Spinoza, democracies are superior to other regime forms is that their institutions are responsive to the desires and values of the people, capturing information vital to specifying the (circumstance-relative) goods. In their deliberative and aggregative mechanisms, democracies effectively institutionalize the sovereign imagination. Consequently, on James’s account, Spinoza’s very restrictive form of democracy fails precisely because it excludes from the political imagination large swaths of constituents, including women, servants, and the poor (134).

Finally, the imagination plays what I am calling a fortifying role by corroborating and making salient what we grasp through reason. Here one might think of the many scholia of the Ethics in which Spinoza appeals to experience to help foster greater commitment to the things that he has demonstrated—presumably not because he worries about the adequacy of the demonstration, but because he knows that we are imaginative, experiential creatures who can more fully commit to rational truths when we see them illustrated. Various essays in this collection suggest that compelling stories, memorable maxims, and images of exemplars, can prompt intellectual reflection and generate greater affective support for rational courses of action (see especially “Freedom of Conscience and Civic Peace” and “Fortitude”). A crucial upshot is that in Spinoza’s view even philosophers have a reason to draw on the imagination for inspiration and support. While this might seem at odds with the passage from the TTP noted above where Spinoza appears to oppose the imagination to the intellect, in fact in the continuation of this passage he writes that those “who have more powerful intellects” are not free from imagination, but rather “have it more under their power” (TTP 2.1). James helps to show that, for Spinoza, the products of the imagination are not ladders to be kicked away once one grasps things as they are. Since we are ineluctably subject to the passions and imagination, we must have such props “under [our] power” so that they can bolster our occasionally weak and failing epistemic capacities.

These essays make a strong case for regarding Spinoza as a shrewd theorist of ethical and political next-bests, one who appreciates the need to accommodate one’s normative recommendations to the crooked timber of humanity. Still, in one of the more distinctive essays in the collection, “The Affective Cost of Philosophical Self-Transformation,” James suggests that Spinoza is not always as attuned to the complexities of human life as he should be. Drawing on the literary works of J.M. Coetzee, she argues that the dogged pursuit of wisdom carries with it an affective downside, as it creates distance between one’s own values and the values of most people, rendering one’s way of life unintelligible to most. (For a similar point in contemporary ethics, see Cheshire Calhoun’s insightful discussion of the democratic illegibility of “moral revolutionaries” in her essay “Moral Failures”). To be fair to Spinoza, he does seem to appreciate something like this problem when he concedes that even the “free” person must occasionally accept the favors of the “ignorant,” lest she incur their scorn, and when she does this, she must repay these favors according to the others’ value system (E4p70s). Put bluntly, one who is perfectly rational must compromise, or at least disguise, her values in order to get along with others. But while Spinoza seems to think that a wise person will be able to navigate the demands of being a good neighbor and citizen without compromising her commitment to a philosophical way of life, James seems to think that moral tradeoffs are inevitable.

Somewhat disappointingly, James does not consider moral tradeoffs in her essay “Freedom and Nature: A Spinozist Invitation.” This piece opens with a discussion of the climate crisis, looking to Spinoza for an account of how we might reconceive of our relationship to (the rest of) nature so as to appreciate the ways in which environmental degradation undermines human liberty. This is a helpful rebuttal to those whose narrowly negative conception of liberty leads them to think that environmental protections restrict human liberty. Still, I worry a bit about the way James frames the problem, as if we are all in this together, working collectively to “generate ways of life that will enhance our liberty by reducing our vulnerability to arbitrary environmental powers” (182). This seems to elide the challenges that confront those of us living in places that have benefited most from, and continue to benefit from, fossil capital. Considerations of justice and fairness require that we, and our representatives, adopt policies that entail some degree of material sacrifice in order to diminish the catastrophic impact that will otherwise fall disproportionately on people who stand at some temporal or geographical remove from us and who bear little to no responsibility for the problem.

What might Spinoza have to say about such sacrifice? On the one hand, he claims that those who are rational will pursue others’ interest as we do our own (E4p37) and will pursue these goods without regard to time (E4p62). This would seem to push in the direction of rationally sacrificing one’s own conveniences for the benefit of humanity. And yet, Spinoza is typically read as a kind of ethical egoist for whom goodness is indexed to one’s striving or power of acting. Such egoism would seem to militate against any course of action that would be personally disempowering.

James does not confront this problem, apparently out of judicious interpretative restraint. She is quick to point out that “the Spinozist position I shall explore does not provide immediate solutions to our environmental problems. How could it?” (170). And, while she notes in the preface that “the essays collected here were written with contemporary philosophical issues in mind” (7), the language here is quite measured: while James might have been bearing contemporary issues in mind when composing these essays, she does not put Spinoza to work answering contemporary philosophical questions, and the essays are not punctuated by bright, bold lessons.

This approach left me somewhat conflicted. While I respect James’s reluctance to compel Spinoza to address our questions, I could not help but wonder what insights a less restrained approach might yield. But for an interpreter of a philosopher whose own motto was caute (with caution), such judiciousness is no great fault. And one looking for an account of Spinoza’s views on the ethics of ordinary life could hardly ask for a better guide than Susan James. Spinoza on Learning to Live Together makes the case for regarding Spinoza, for all of his rarefied intellectualism, as a theorist who is deeply attuned to the challenges to, and importance of, living cooperatively with others.