Spirituality and the Good Life: Philosophical Approaches

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David McPherson (ed.), Spirituality and the Good Life: Philosophical Approaches, Cambridge University Press, 2017, 237pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781107133006.

Reviewed by Matthew C. Halteman, Calvin College


Charmed by potent cocktails of Hadot, Gadamer, Nussbaum, and Rorty, idealistic humanities students become convinced that the spiritual heart of philosophy is self-transformation for the ultimate purpose of social transformation. With authenticity and justice as their guiding motivations, they imagine a vocation devoted to liberating exercises of mind, heart, and body, anticipating that the resulting invigoration of their knowing and being will catalyze flourishing lives of radical service to the world. They aspire to philosophy as a way of life, seeing philosophical discourse as a promising tool for achieving that loftier end. Some years later, dulled by overpriced cocktails in discounted conference hotels, wary job-seekers begin to worry that academic philosophy has no spiritual heart and that becoming a professor might be an obstacle to philosophical living. With job-security and prestige as their guiding motivations, they forsake work-life balance to devote every waking hour to some small parcel of theoretical hinterland, chagrined that the resulting research seems likely to consign them to careers of grooming their pet isms with the same dozen fellow experts. The cost of becoming a pro at philosophical discourse, they fear, is selling out philosophy as a way of life.

Many of us have experienced some version of this deflating bait-and-switch at some point, but it's an increasingly encouraging time for philosophers interested in cultivating resonance between what they do for a living and how they seek to live and help others live. For one thing, academic publishing in this sector is picking up steam. Since 2012, the guild has produced a major collection honoring and extending Hadot's genre-defining work on philosophy as spiritual practice,[1] a major critical reappraisal of Hadot's legacy and its putative lack of emphasis on the essential role of reasoned argumentation in ancient philosophical ways of life,[2] and any number of university press monographs by academic philosophers highlighting for general audiences the value of philosophy for living a meaningful life.[3] For another thing, there's hope that this flurry of activity will become a growth industry behind increasing institutional support for work in this area. In 2018, The National Endowment for the Humanities funded a workshop on "Reviving Philosophy as a Way of Life," and the Andrew W. Mellon Foundation is currently supporting curricular innovation to put "the good life" back at center stage in college philosophy courses.[4]

David McPherson's edited collection offers welcome additional proof of life in this resurgent genre. Aimed at professional audiences, the book seeks to foreground the importance of spirituality for two subfields in which it has "suffered neglect": virtue ethics and philosophy of religion (3). The book has a brief introduction, twelve largely free-standing chapters ranging in quality from solid to superior, a select bibliography, and an index. McPherson frames the book around a "working definition" of spirituality as "a practical life-orientation that is shaped by what is taken to be a self-transcending source of meaning, which involves strong normative demands, including demands of the sacred or the reverence-worthy" (1). The chapters, then, aim to flesh out this conception of spirituality and demonstrate its importance for philosophy by attending to one or more of three basic tasks: elucidating the relationships between and among philosophy, spirituality, and religion; clarifying the import of spirituality for understanding virtues (such as piety and sincerity) and capacities (e.g., desire and sensory experience) that figure importantly into good living; and developing examples of spiritual practices from particular traditions (for instance, the Jewish Sabbath, Muslim prayer, and Buddhist compassion) that also shed light on how spiritual transformation works in general.

Given the subjective and personal character of spirituality and the range of forms it takes at different times of life and in different cultural and religious traditions, it is fitting that the book's contributions represent a diversity of perspectives. Contributors range in professional rank from assistant (four authors), associate and full (five authors), to emeritus professors (three authors), write from within a variety of methodological and historical traditions (analytic, continental, ancient, medieval, Asian, Arabic, and Jewish), and provide coverage of resources for philosophical engagement with spirituality from agnostic, Buddhist, Christian, Confucian, Islamic, and Jewish perspectives. On the whole, the book makes good headway toward its goals of "heeding the call for a more 'humane' mode of philosophy (as opposed to scientistic modes)"[5] and "seeking to recover an ancient conception of philosophy as itself a 'spiritual exercise' and part of a 'way of life'" (4-5) even if the coherence and focus of the volume are challenged in places by its methodological and topical breadth. The book is a good choice for research libraries, and a wise acquisition, too, for liberal arts colleges whose missions stress spiritual formation.

In what follows, I summarize McPherson's introduction and offer brief overviews of select chapters organized under the three main emphases identified above: spirituality and religion; virtues and capacities of the spiritual life; and spiritual practices and transformation. Though these headings are not part of the intended structure of the book, and many chapters could no doubt be framed as exemplary of more than one of them, they are, I hope, still useful tools for capturing the spirit and range of the collection.

In a short "Introduction", McPherson unpacks the above working definition of spirituality as follows:

spirituality involves spiritual practices -- e.g., practices of prayer, meditation, self-examination, repentance, mindfulness, study, contemplation, worship, thanksgiving, communal living, charity, fasting, keeping the Sabbath, ritual observance, going on retreats or pilgrimages, imitating saints, habituation in virtue, etc. -- that aim to direct and transform one's life as a whole toward increasing spiritual fulfillment, i.e., toward a more meaningful life. (1)

He notes that while the topic of spirituality has received attention from empirical psychologists, it has been neglected by philosophers whom one might expect to be intrigued by the connections between spirituality and religion (in the philosophy of religion) and spirituality and the good life (in virtue ethics). He offers four reasons that philosophers might be skeptical of the idea of spirituality; it could be that they find it (1) "overly vague," (2) so "focused on inward life" as to be inaccessible to abstract analysis, (3) off-puttingly "mystical or 'new-agey,'" or (4) "problematically dualistic," especially from the perspectives of certain forms of naturalism prominent in the discipline "that can be resistant to 'spiritual matters'" (3-4). It is these "scientistic outlooks" (and especially their inadequacy for "mak[ing] sense of our lives") that McPherson locates as the central critical target of the collection. The aim is to "get past the aforementioned concerns and to put the topic of spirituality firmly on the contemporary philosophical agenda by showing the extent to which it connects with central questions about the good life" that some naturalistic frameworks are putatively ill-equipped to address (4).

Spirituality and Religion

In "Homo Religiosus: Does Spirituality Have a Place in Neo-Aristotelian Virtue Ethics?", McPherson specifies this advertised general advantage of his account of spirituality over naturalism in a critique of "neo-Aristotelian ethical naturalism" (Rosalind Hursthouse et al.). What such views fail to appreciate, McPherson maintains, is that yearning for "the sacred or reverence-worthy" is a natural feature of human beings and thus essential for an account of human flourishing and the virtues that promote it:

If . . . human beings are homo religiosus -- i.e., naturally drawn to spirituality understood as a practical life-orientation that is shaped by what is taken to be a self-transcending source of meaning, which involves strong normative demands, including the demands of the sacred or the reverence-worthy -- then a certain virtue is crucial to human well-being that has tended to be neglected or seen as no virtue at all: viz., the virtue of piety . . . , the virtue concerned with a proper relationship in feeling and in action to the sacred or the reverence-worthy. (74)

This idea that we can't explain prominent features of our practical experience without appeal to something beyond experience is the topic of John Cottingham's "Philosophy, Religion, and Spirituality"). Cottingham mobilizes pop philosophy (Sam Harris), literature (George Eliot), and phenomenological description to identify a "cosmic dimension" (16 ff.) of spirituality that is "normative" in that it subjects us to "inescapable demands" from "the sacred" (26) to undergo a transformative process of "radical interior change" (28). On Cottingham's view, both "new atheist" conceptions of "spirituality without religion" (14-15) and "nontheistic meditative forms of spirituality, such as Buddhism and other Eastern traditions . . . seem to have an essentially quietist character" that cannot adequately account for the felt moral demands of our deepest spiritual experiences (25). Cottingham concludes that "when we unpack exactly what is involved in the activities and experiences we call spiritual, it is not easy to make fully adequate sense of spirituality, and of its importance for human life, without something close to a theistic framework" (27). Cottingham explicitly eschews "imperialistic ambitions" to "browbeat" spiritual non-theists "into admitting that they are really theists whether they know it or not" (26). Certain of his descriptions of the "cosmic dimension," however, may strike some readers as verging on coercive (18: "I submit that most readers who honestly interrogate themselves will find that . . . "; 21: "if we start to unpack the phenomenology of [spiritual transformation], we quickly see . . . ").

Virtues and Capacities of the Spiritual Life

May Sim's "Identifying with the Confucian Heaven: Immanent and Transcendent Dao" explores the intersections of moral, spiritual, and religious life in the works of Confucius and Mencius, arguing contra prominent secular interpretations of Confucianism that there are resources in the tradition for seeking a transformed religious life "that identifies the human and the absolute" (214). Her treatment of Mencius' account of "Heaven's way as sincerity (cheng 誠, genuineness)" both resonates with Cottingham's view that spirituality and its virtues engage transcendent demands on humankind, and provides a helpful counterpoint to his characterization of Eastern traditions as generally lacking an account of how such demands bind individual human beings to ultimate reality:

This analysis also makes clear why sincerity is Heaven's way and being enlightened about the good is key to being sincere. Even though tian [Heaven] does not speak, the culture (which includes language) is decreed and preserved by tian. Since tian is the source of goodness in everything, creating a norm with everything it produces (6A 6.8), which norm of human beings is virtue, it follows that human behavior is most tian-like when we know what is good and enact the good. This means that we are to act in such a way that we only say things that we can bring to completion, just as tian produces everything and mandates each thing's norm. That neither speech nor action is arbitrary, but each is guided by the good that unites everyone (because the virtues are innate in every human being), offers the identity between Heaven and human beings for Mencius. (214)

Confucian sincerity is but one of a variety of human virtues and capacities under discussion here that might open the way between immanence and transcendence. Writing as a Christian theist in "The Virtue of Piety", Robert C. Roberts defines piety as "a disposition to appreciate the glory of God and his creation and thus to feel inhibited from actions that violate its order" (62). In "Desire and the Spiritual Life" (, Fiona Ellis resists reductive readings of Nietzsche and Schopenhauer that see life-affirmative desire as fundamentally egoistic and anti-religious in favor of a creative appropriation of their insights that reserves space for a kind of transcendent "unselfing" desire that "is central to the spiritual life" (87) and that "draws us toward the values that are fundamental to such a life" (98). Even the seemingly pedestrian capacity of sensory experience can be spiritually elevating, according to Mark R. Wynn's ingenious "Between Heaven and Earth: Sensory Experience and the Goods of the Spiritual Life". Combining insights from Aquinas and William James, Wynn constructs an account of spiritual progress wherein "the life of the senses and the life of the spirit are mutually involving" (117), leading to "a newly colored and newly ordered" perceptual field (115).

Spiritual Practices and Transformation

As helpful as theoretical accounts of spiritual transformation and the virtues and capacities that enable it can be, there's no substitute for the experience of undergoing transformation oneself through the use of spiritual practices. Second best, perhaps, is reading fine-grained, beautifully-rendered first-personal accounts of what such practices look and feel like from inside a particular tradition. One such account is Samuel Fleischacker's masterful "The Jewish Sabbath as a Spiritual Practice", in which Wynn's arresting notion of elevated, self-and-world transforming perception becomes concretely manifest in the story of how shabbat observance in Orthodox and traditional Jewish communities can develop a "spiritual virtue" that "remakes the perception of people who acquire it," furnishing them with "premises for the peculiarly Jewish ways of understanding God and the human good" (131).

Fleischacker begins with concrete descriptions of what it's like to observe shabbat in the rhythm of ordinary life. Though observance is shaped by prohibitions (against cooking, writing, using money, manipulating appliances, driving a vehicle (118)), those restrictions can be freeing in that they create space for one to engage in activities that are both enjoyable for their own sake and potentially rejuvenating for the resumption of chores and professional obligations in the week to come. "One can pray, sing, read, have elaborate meals, visit family and friends, take walks, and make love (something that is especially encouraged, between spouses)" (119). Though observance may feel burdensome at first, Fleischacker explains, the continued practice results both in enormous relief on the day itself (he speaks of "joy" in the freedom from "cellphones, email, and Facebook, in particular" (120)) and in the longer-term development of "'shabbat consciousness' that runs through one's life" (121), guiding decisions about school, work, socializing, and travel throughout the week. On a deeper level, this "creative rest" that punctuates the creative labors of the work week is precisely what allows one to appreciate those labors: to stand back and "frame" them as having "intrinsic value" and "inherent beauty," just as "God -- even God -- can see His work as a whole only if He desists from it for a moment, and as it were holds it off from Himself, as something to contemplate" (127). But if one imitates God in observing shabbat, the prohibitions also remind one of one's finitude (especially the tendency to make idols of self and work) and of God's transcendence beyond all created things. Seeking God, one's highest end, must thus proceed by the negative way: "only by first emptying things . . . of their apparent divinity, and then discovering God's presence in that emptiness" (130).

Other spiritual practices that receive edifying treatments here are Islamic prayer (Mukhtar H. Ali, "The Power of the Spoken Word: Prayer, Invocation, and Supplication in Islam"), Ignatian companionship especially in the consolation of friends through personal presence to their suffering in times of desolation (Karen Stohr, "Aristotelian Friendship and Ignatian Companionship"), the Buddhist cultivation of compassion through visualizing the suffering of others and empathizing with them (Richard White, "Starting with Compassion"), and the agnostic cultivation of a skeptical "faith without belief" that proceeds by "living and acting in the hope that there is more than a nonnegligible chance" that "God exists and cares for human beings" (227) (John Houston, "Agnostic Spirituality").

All told, the combination of theoretically and practically focused essays creates a rich and productive hermeneutic tension for the reader. Some chapters invite the thought that spirituality aims to draw us into religious identities in which fledgling spiritual yearnings are trained and fulfilled by very specific types of communal belonging. Others invite us to wonder whether religious identities aim at spiritual transformation, providing a workshop of time-tested communal and individual practices that are knit together by historical and doctrinal identification, but find their deepest fulfillment in transformed adherents working together toward authenticity and justice in the world. There are different senses, perhaps, in which both insights are wise and potentially transformative, especially when held in tension.

[1] Michael Chase, Stephen R.L. Clark, and Michael McGhee, eds., Philosophy as a Way of Life Ancients and Moderns: Essays in Honor of Pierre Hadot (Oxford: Wiley Blackwell, 2013).

[2] See John M. Cooper, Pursuits of Wisdom: Six Ways of Life in Ancient Philosophy from Socrates to Plotinus (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 2012).

[3] Two recent examples are Justin E. H. Smith, The Philosopher: A History in 6 Types (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 2016) and Iddo Landau, Finding Meaning in an Imperfect World (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2017).

[4] Read more about the NEH initiative (accessed September 24, 2018) and about the Mellon initiative  (accessed September 24, 2018).

[5] McPherson has John Cottingham's sense of "humane philosophy" in mind here. See Cottingham, Philosophy of Religion: Towards a More Humane Approach (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2014).