Stanley Cavell and Literary Studies: Consequences of Skepticism

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Richard Eldridge and Bernard Rhie (eds.), Stanley Cavell and Literary Studies: Consequences of Skepticism, Continuum, 2011, 288pp., $100.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781441129451.

Reviewed by Gerald Bruns, University of Notre Dame


This is a volume of papers from a conference held at Harvard University in 2010 to honor the American philosopher Stanley Cavell (b. 1926), and particularly to celebrate the publication of his autobiographical fragments, Little Did I Know (Stanford University Press, 2010). The theme of the conference, "Cavell and Literary Studies," is perhaps testimony to the fact that, apart from philosophers who were among his devoted students at Harvard (James Conant, Richard Eldridge, Richard Fleming, Timothy Gould, Stephen Mulhall, among many others), Cavell's most enthusiastic readers have been literary critics.[1] Still, the theme may seem a bit thin. During the last thirty years literary study has become less literary than social and political in its topics and debates. A short list of current critical approaches would include, under the rubric of "Cultural Studies," gender studies, ethnic studies, queer theory, postcolonial studies, and, more recently, cybernetics. What holds these pursuits together as a family is a suspicion that careful philological attention to the work of art or literature itself is an aestheticism that holds itself aloof from the real world.[2] But perhaps this state of affairs is simply one of the "consequences of skepticism," namely a disappointment with the inscrutability of artworks, their material resistance to the demands of cognition and utility.

Happily, however, even conference papers inspired by Cavell's work cannot fail to be of interest. This volume is divided into two parts, "Principles" and "Practice." Toril Moi begins the whole by raising the question of whether philosophy can practice criticism, which is to say "the work of reading, thinking, and writing about literature and other art forms" (20), and as an example of such a possibility she refers us to the work of the French novelist and philosopher Simone de Beauvoir (1908-1986), particularly an essay from 1946 on "Literature and Metaphysics," which -- in a way that anticipated some of Martha Nussbaum's later arguments about the novel as a practice and not just an illustration of moral philosophy -- "claims that only the novel allows the writer to convey 'an aspect of metaphysical experience that cannot otherwise be manifested: its subjective singularity and dramatic character as well as its ambiguity'" (24). That is, the novel is a form of thinking by means of examples: it presents us with moral dilemmas at levels of complexity that defeat the application of principles and rules.[3] It follows that the close reading of a novel is a participation in such ground-level reflection, where thinking is not so much ratiocination as a form of responsiveness to what situations call for in the way of action. Recall Cavell's essay, "The Politics of Interpretation," where he says that we cannot claim to have read and understood a text until we begin to understand how it has read us, that is, opened us up to a critical self-questioning that alters us in some fundamental way.[4] As if a philosophical reading were a practice of what Cavell calls "moral perfectionism," where the capacity for experience entails the necessity of changing, not just one's life, but one's self.[5]

The need for such a change in the experience of contemporary art and literature is the upshot of R. M. Berry's excellent contribution, "'Is "Us" Me?' Cultural Studies and the Universality of Aesthetic Judgments," which is an effort to refocus the attention of literary study upon some foundational aesthetic questions -- for example: How do we know that the thing before us is a work of art? -- one of Marcel Duchamp's Readymades, for example, or a text by Gertrude Stein:

Colored hats are necessary to show that curls are worn by an addition of blank spaces, this makes the difference between single lines and a broad stomach[6]

Berry refers us to Cavell's "Music Discomposed" (1965), which is an attempt to come to terms with the question of what counts as music at a time when even contemporary composers were at odds with one another on this issue.[7] The problem of modernism in art and music is that aesthetic judgments can no longer be justified in the way Kant imagined but are socially and historically contingent, internal to local and transient communities that are also cultures of innovation and argument (manifestos, for example) as to what counts as art. Here the question is where one stands, or finds oneself, with respect to the eccentricities of avant-garde artworlds. In "Aesthetic Problems of Modern Philosophy" (1965), Cavell writes: What is important "is the fact that we may see an undoubted musician speak about [atonal music] in ways similar . . . to the way he behaves toward, say, Beethoven, and then we may sense that, though similar, it is a new world and that to understand a new world it is imperative to concentrate upon its inhabitants." The problem is essentially anthropological: "the accommodation of the new music [is] one of naturalizing ourselves to a new form of life, a new world" (MWM84). Only by changing oneself can one begin to see one's surroundings for oneself, even at the risk of alienating oneself from one's past or from institutions (the school, the museum, the art market) that confer "legitimacy" on cultural products.

Berry, for his part, invites us into the underground world of contemporary experimental fiction, where we encounter such things as Michael Martone's The Blue Guide to Indiana, which is not a novel nor even a work of narrative but rather a hilarious parody of a travel guidebook, nominally one in a series of the famous "Blue Guides" that for the past century have guided tourists to (mainly European) cities renowned for their art museums, architecture, and colorful byways.[8] (Residents of South Bend, Indiana -- and admirers of Cavell's book on Hollywood comedies of remarriage -- should consult pages 30-31:

Here, the classic movie The Philadelphia Story, plays daily each midnight at the restored St. Joe Theater downtown. The picture has been shown this way continuously since shortly after its premiere in 1940. These performances are events, with the audience members dressing as their favorite characters played on film by Katherine Hepburn, Cary Grant, James Stewart, and many others. Having memorized the dialogue, the movie's fans also act out the more memorable scenes, speaking directly to and along with the actors on the screen. Fans break golf clubs and re-enact the punch in the snout, the meeting in the library, and even blow the trumpet for the fox hunt.

Imagine The Philadelphia Story in place of The Rocky Horror Picture Show.)

Contributors to Stanley Cavell and Literary Studies include two longstanding literary commentators (and frequent critics) of Cavell's work, Anthony Cascardi and Charles Altieri. In "Cavell and Kant: The Work of Criticism and the Work of Art," Cascardi also emphasizes the contingency of aesthetic judgments when it comes to modernist works of art: "It seems to be modernism's aim to suggest that art involves work, and sometimes emphatically contrary work, of resisting facile promises of happiness produced by facile forms of culture. The corresponding task of criticism is to meet these challenges. Its work is not simply to draw out the ways in which words in works of art ought to respond to the demand that they be thoroughly meant, but also to draw attention to the fact that they need not necessarily mean anything" (61). Not that artworks are meaningless; rather, their intelligibility can no longer be construed in terms of the discursive regimes that surround them but only by careful attention to the things themselves and their specific conceptual contexts.

Charles Altieri likewise emphasizes the limits of "discursive language" or the giving of reasons for addressing (or, indeed, experiencing) an object as a work of art. Altieri's question is whether Cavell, despite "his resistance to convention" and his "openness to what artworks do," doesn't sometimes (or maybe often) skirt these limits by "tilt[ing] the aesthetic, in life and in art, back to the ethical" (77). What Altieri has in mind here is not entirely clear, but one recalls the following from "Music Discomposed": "In emphasizing the experiences of fraudulence and trust as essential to the experience of art, I am in effect claiming that the answer to the question 'What is art?' will in part be an answer which explains why it is we treat certain objects, or how we can treat certain objects, in ways normally reserved for treating persons" (MWM189): which is to say that our relation to the artwork, if there is to be any meaningful relation at all, is one of responsiveness rather than disinterested appraisal. Cavell's aesthetics, despite his constant appeal to Wittgenstein's remarks on the shortfall of criteria in human forms of life, is more exorbitant than Wittgenstein's philological counsel, namely that "Aesthetics is descriptive. What it does is draw one's attention to certain features, to place things side by side so as to exhibit these features."[9] As a critic, Cavell seems at times more romantic than modern, as in his essays on Shakespeare where his attention is almost always focused on Shakespeare's characters and our relation to them, in contrast (for example) to questions of form.[10]

Not that Cavell is blind or deaf to the materiality of language, as Garrett Stewart shows in "The World Viewed: Skepticism Degree Zero," which takes off from Cavell's "Being Odd, Getting Even" (1984), specifically his pages on the experience of the sound or look of words in one of Edgar Allan Poet's short stories, "The Imp of the Perverse," which is populated by "imp-words": impulse, impels, impatient, important, imperceptible, impossible, unimpressive, imprisoned -- and, of course, imp. Cavell's thought is that language is not just an instrument at our disposal but is made of these "little moles" with "lives of their own" for which we bear (nearly) as much responsibility as we do toward things we mean to say.[11] Stewart's favorite example of the material autonomy of language is the figure of syllepsis, which is a species of punning (for example: "He lost his coat and then his temper"; compare Cavell on "feeding the cat" and "feeding the meter"). To pursue his thought Stewart turns from Cavell to Giorgio Agamben's The End of the Poem, with its reaffirmation of the French poet Mallarmé's thesis that a poem is made of words but not of any of the things that we use words to produce: concepts, propositions, descriptions, expressions.[12] It may not be, as Mallarmé thought, that poetry breaks with the practices of ordinary language, but it seems right to say that poets inhabit language in ways that readers need to learn in much the way anyone learns to inhabit a foreign country. Cavell's position seems to be that there is no one way to inhabit language, which is one of the arguments in his chapter on "Sentences" in The Senses of Walden (1972), where Thoreau the writer is found to be perfectly at home among Walden's birds: his prose is as "natural and instinctive" as their sounds, the more so as he is "sometimes . . . content to rest from his mightier or migratory flights and let his words warble and chuckle to themselves (e. g., pun or alliterate), pleased as it were just with his own notes for company, or, as he puts it elsewhere, humming while he works."[13]

Too bad this volume doesn't contain a study of Cavell's own prose, with its obsessive "craving for parentheses" (MWMx), or at least some attention to his repeated inquiries into the question of how philosophy is to be written.[14] In the foreword to The Claim of Reason, Cavell says that his fascination with Wittgenstein's Philosophical Investigations "had to do with my response to it as a feat of writing . . . . Why does he write this way?"[15] This is also a regulating question of Cavell's writings on Thoreau and Emerson -- especially Emerson, whose prose is made of "the wild variation and excesses of linguistic form that have always interfered with rationality" (CH38). One could just as well apply this description to Cavell's writing, with its musings, fantasies, fragments, improvisations, and digressions -- in "The Philosopher and American Life" (1983) Cavell imagines "a book of philosophy . . . written with next to no forward motion, one that culminates in each sentence" (QO18), rather like many of Gertrude Stein's writings, where the idea is to "begin again and begin again, prolong the present, use everything."[16]

In "A Storied World: On Meeting and Being Met," Naomi Scheman takes up the concept of acknowledgment from the standpoint of being the "second person" -- the person we are before being shaped into an "I" by episodes of "being met" (being greeted, hailed, even cradled). Scheman's essay is something like a feminist's alternative to Cavell's attempt (particularly in The Claim of Reason) to work through the desperate but sometimes desirable condition of human separateness in which, among other possibilities of privation (or freedom), I am unable to make myself recognizable to others and perhaps even to myself. It would be interesting to speculate on the connection between Cavell's pages on "the fear of inexpressiveness" (CR351ff.) and the baroque density of his prose -- and then on his turn toward Emersonian notions of self-formation, and finally his "intuition" that "there is an internal connection between philosophy and autobiography," by which he means a connection between doing philosophy and finding (or inventing) one's own voice.[17]

The essays here devoted to "Practice" are generally accomplished attempts to engage some of Cavell's signature literary topics -- Shakespeare, Emerson, Thoreau, Romanticism, but also (interestingly) modern poetry and fiction. In "William Shakespeare and Stanley Cavell: Acknowledging, Confessing, and Tragedy," Sarah Beckwith argues that "Shakespearean dramaturgy is a search for forgiveness and that in the process confession becomes a vehicle of conversion and acknowledgment, as new forms of drama inherit the burdens of language in making and breaking human communities" (125). Joshua Wilner's essay, '''Communicating with Objects': Romanticism, Skepticism, and 'The Specter of Animism' in Cavell and Wordsworth," recuperates the idea that for Romantics the world is not made of brute objects but of natural things that, as in Wordsworth's "Lines Composed a Few Miles Above Tintern Abbey," have a claim on our imaginative ability to address them (as we do our words or works of art) as things with their own life and self-possession.

Of special importance in this connection is Elisa New's "Near, Neighboring, and Next-to in Cavell's The Senses of Walden and William Carlos Williams's 'Fine Work with Pitch and Copper,'" which breaks with the assumption that governs (and limits) most efforts to negotiate the boundaries between philosophy and literature, namely that narrative, whether in drama, the novel, or even poetry, gives the definition of "literature." New's essay is an argument against "the conventions of linear reading" that proceed "as if words had no letters to scan one after another, no sounds to negotiate" (181). She devotes much of her essay to a reading of a poem by William Carlos Williams that concerns itself less with what the poem means than with how its sudden, unconventional line breaks situate words physically -- and therefore musically -- on the page:

Now they are resting

in the fleckless light

separately and in unison

like the sacks

of sifted stone

regularly by twos

about the flat roof

ready after lunch

to be opened and strewn[18]

The poem is an observation of an ordinary urban scene couched in ordinary language, but New's point is that what matters are "the visual aspects of the poem": "Run your eye up and down the page, and then across from left to right and back again, and you begin to see angles, as well as the squares that are part of the page's own architecture" (188). Interestingly, New takes her cue from Thoreau's counsel against "abstraction," which means, in relation to words, a philological practice of "slow reading" that allows the visual and aural reality of language to survive the instrumental burden of its semantic functions (18). Against this many would no doubt cite Cavell's admonition from A Pitch of Philosophy: "the particularity of words does not consist in their material or spatial integrity: their criteria of identity are not the same as the criteria of identity of sticks and stones" (PP70). Cavell is perhaps more at home with the sound than the look of words, and might appreciate New's observation that the title of his Thoreau book, "The Senses of Walden," is a "study in fricatives, a set piece of lips, tongue, teeth and palate where slight variations in the expelled air past the tongue or teeth drawn from the front to the back of the lips make the difference between 's' and 'z,' 'f' and 'v'" (182). In any case, New's argument is that inhabiting language in this materialized way requires (like the reading of Cavell's prose) patience: "Words build: they do not merely address or reflect or make good on the promises or claims of titles. Words generate trails that sprawl and branch; syntaxes budding in new relations, cruxes, conundrums; axes of difficulty arching over new cliffs of possibility, each turn producing another turn -- if, that is, you have time for this sort of thing" (183).

Meanwhile the final two essays in this volume appear to reaffirm the primacy of narrative. Andrew Miller, in "For All You Know," takes up Cavell's Little Did I Know, which invites occasion for reflection on "a mode of thinking" that Miller, following Stuart Hampshire, calls "the optative," that is, the position of "retrospection and regret" in which "I try to come to terms with who I have become by comparison with whom I have not become" (196). Basically Miller's essay concerns the narrative function of What if?, which is a prominent feature of Cavell's reflection on his memories, especially in view of his nomadic childhood:

Travel suggests for me a screen of memories and decisions of its own, oriented around questions of my life marked by the shifts of what I have variously called home, and of course by the inevitable wondering . . . of what it would have been to have been born just here, where lives are uncannily similar and different from mine, evidently tied to the familiar wonder of having had different parents, hence the sense of oneself as an unfound foundling.[19]

Finally, in "Empiricism, Exhaustion, and Meaning What We Say: Cavell and Contemporary Fiction," Robert Chodat wonders why "Cavell has taken so remarkably little interest in the fiction of his close contemporaries"? -- meaning, in this case, the novels John Barth, Robert Barthelme, Robert Coover, and William Gass composed during the 1960s: works that reject "the traditional empiricist assumptions of modern [realist] fiction" (214). It's not entirely clear what motivates this question. One could just as well ask why Cavell ignores the poetry of John Ashbery (b. 1927) -- or, for that matter, the poetry of one of his own students, Charles Bernstein, one of the most innovative American poets of the last forty or more years.[20] Again, an answer worth serious reflection is that Cavell's interests came to lie elsewhere than in matters of form and of language as the material of writing, but it is precisely these matters that occupy the attention of writers of fiction as well as of poetry -- as William Gass (b. 1924) argues in "Philosophy and the Form of Fiction": "The concepts of the philosophers speak, the words of the novelist are mute; the philosopher invites us to pass through his words to his subject: man, God, nature, moral law; while the novelist, if he is any good, will keep us kindly imprisoned in his language -- there is literally nothing else."[21] (Interestingly, Gass himself is a professor of philosophy as well as a fiction-writer.) Chodat's proposal is that fiction writers of the 1960s recuperated the romantic concept of literature as world-making, and this is certainly right, but in the bargain these writers also called attention (often ironically or even satirically) to the artifice, the fictionality, that this project requires -- hence the term frequently applied to this material: "metafiction," as if the novel were finally not so much a medium of world-making ("not a view of the cosmos but a cosmos itself," as Barth famously said) as an investigation of fiction-writing itself as a form of life.[22]

Of course, if one looks back on Cavell's writings during this critical period, what stands out is his conflicted experience of writing philosophy. The foreword to Must We Mean What We Say? deserves renewed attention whenever one tries to engage Cavell's texts: "what needs to be explained," he writes, "is that the writing of philosophy is difficult in a new way. It is the difficulty modern philosophy shares with the modern arts": namely, that it has reached "a moment in which history and its conventions can no longer be taken for granted; the time in which music and painting and poetry (like nations) have to define themselves against their pasts; the beginning of the moment in which each of the arts becomes its own subject, as if its immediate artistic task is to establish its own existence" -- or, perhaps more accurately, its own singular reason for existing (MWMxii). Imagine philosophy as a problem of modernist aesthetics, where the question of what counts as philosophy is the (open) question, "How is it to be written?" (MWMxxiii).

[1] All but two of the contributors to this volume are literary critics. The same “disproportion,” just to call it that, characterizes Ordinary Language Criticism: Literary Thinking after Cavell after Wittgenstein, ed. Kenneth Dauber and Walter Jost (Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 2003). By contrast, see two more recent collections with essays on Cavell chiefly by philosophers: Contending with Cavell, ed. Russell Goodman (New York: Oxford University Press, 2005), and Reading Cavell, ed. Alice Crary and Sanford Shieh (London: Routledge, 2006).

[2] For a counterstatement to what I have just said, see Rita Felski, “Those Who Disdain Cultural Studies Don’t Know What They’re Talking About,” Chronicle of Higher Education, July 23, 1999. See also Felski, “Modernist Studies and Cultural Studies, Modernism/Modernity, 10, no. 3 (2003), 501-17.

[3] See Nussbaum, “The Golden Bowl as Moral Philosophy,” New Literary History, 15, no. 1 (Autumn 1983), 179-202; later reprinted in Love’s Knowledge: Essays on Philosophy and Literature (New York: Oxford University Press, 1990), pp. 125-47.

[4] The essay first appeared in Critical Inquiry, 9, no. 1 (1982), 157-78, and later in Themes Out of School: Effects and Causes (San Francisco: North Point Press, 1983), pp. 27-59, esp. pp. 51-53 on “reading and being read” as a “philosophical kind of reading.”

Conditions Handsome and Unhandsome: The Constitution of Emersonian Perfectionism (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1990), esp. pp. 52-53. Hereafter CH.

[6] Tender Buttons (1914) (Los Angeles: Sun & Moon Press, n. d.), p. 24.

[7] Must We Mean What We Say? (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1969), pp. 180-212, esp. pp. 205-10. Hereafter MWM.

[8] The Blue Guide to Indiana (Normal/Tallahassee: FC2, 2001). FC2, otherwise known as the Fiction Collective, is a small press devoted to innovative works that fall outside the commercial horizon of most publishing houses.

[9] Wittgenstein’s Lectures: Cambridge, 1932-33, comp. Alice Ambrose and Margaret MacDonald, ed. Alice Ambrose (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1989), p. 38.  See Marjorie Perloff, “The Poetics of Description: Wittgenstein on the Aesthetic,” Ordinary Language Criticism, 211-44.

[10] See Gerald L. Bruns, “Stanley Cavell’s Shakespeare,” Tragic Thoughts at the End of Philosophy: Language, Literature, and Ethical Theory (Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1999), pp. 181-97, esp. pp. 187-94.

[11] In Quest of the Ordinary: Lines of Skepticism and Romanticism (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1988), pp. 124-25. Hereafter QO. Cavell mentions in passing that this “perversity” of language is essentially “poetic” in character, but he goes on to insist, perhaps a bit perversely, that “the perverseness of language, working without, even against, our thought and its autonomy, is a function not just of necessarily recurring imps of words but of the necessity for us speakers of language (us authors of it, or imps, Or Emperors and Empresses of it) to mean something in and by our words, to desire to say something, certain things rather than others, in certain ways rather than others, or else to work to avoid meaning them” (p. 125).

[12] See Agamben, The End of the Poem: Studies in Poetics (Stanford: Stanford University Press, 1999).

[13] The Senses of Walden: Expanded Version (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1992), p. 41.

[14] Cavell’s foreword to Must We Mean What We Say?, for example, is devoted entirely to the question of writing. See esp. pp. xxiii: “The topics of the modern, of the philosophy of philosophy, and of the form of philosophical writing, come together in the question: What is the audience of philosophy? For the answer to this question will contribute to the answer to the questions: What is philosophy? How is it to be written?” In the current volume, Lawrence Rhu refers to Cavell as “a writer of prose that competes with poetry in the experience that it seeks to effect in its readers” (pp. 138).  Unfortunately he doesn’t give us any citations or analysis to explain what he means by this, although he repeats his statement verbatim a few pages later (p. 146).

[15] The Claim of Reason: Wittgenstein, Skepticism, Morality, and Tragedy (New York: Oxford University Press, 1979), p. 70. Hereafter CR.

[16] Gertrude Stein, “Composition as Explanation,” Selected Writings of Gertrude Stein, ed. Carl Van Vechten (New York: Vintage Books, 1962), p. 518. Of course, Cavell is probably thinking of Wittgenstein’s Philosophical Investigations—which, however, may be closer to Gertrude Stein’s modernism than many philosophers realize. See Marjorie Perloff, Wittgenstein’s Ladder: Poetic Language and the Strangeness of the Ordinary (Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 1996), esp. Chapter  3: “‘Grammar in Use’: Wittgenstein/Gertrude Stein/Marinetti” (pp. 83-114).

[17] A Pitch of Philosophy: Autobiographical Exercises (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1994), p. vii. Hereafter PP. See Arthur Danto critical response to Cavell on this point in “Philosophical Writing and Actual Experience,” Beyond Representation: Philosophy and Poetic Imagination, ed. Richard Eldridge (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996), pp. 90-106.

[18] “Fine Work with Pitch and Copper,” Selected Poems (New York: New Directions, 1985), p. 107.

[19] Little Did I Know: Excerpts from Memory (Stanford: Stanford University Press, 2010), p. 179.

[20] It is worth noting that Bernstein is the author of a very interesting essay on the style of The Claim of Reason against the background of the prominence of “juxtaposition and collage” in modernist writing. See Bernstein, “The Objects of Meaning: Reading Cavell, Reading Wittgenstein, Content’s Dream: Essays, 1975-1984(Los Angeles: Sun & Moon Press, 1986), pp. 165-83, esp. pp. 166-67.

[21] Fiction and the Figures of Life (Boston: Nonpareil Books, 1970), p. 8. Hereafter FF.

[22] Gass writes: “the forms of fiction serve as the material upon which further forms can be imposed. Indeed, many of the so-called antinovels are really metafictions” (FF25). See Robert Scholes, “Metafiction,” The Iowa Review, 1, no. 4 (1970), 100-15.