Subhuman: The Moral Psychology of Human Attitudes to Animals

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T.J. Kasperbauer, Subhuman: The Moral Psychology of Human Attitudes to Animals, Oxford University Press, 2018, 233pp., $34.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780190695811.

Reviewed by John Basl, Northeastern University


If you regularly teach or otherwise discuss issues of animal ethics, consider whether this experience is familiar to you: You spend time in class carefully discussing various arguments for the conclusion that our treatment of non-human animals in factory farms or other conditions are incommensurate with the moral status of such animals. You work to ensure that students understand the views and show them that many of their simple objections are inadequate. Several, perhaps many, of your students are familiar, in some way, with some of the empirical facts regarding these practices. Several, in my experience more and more over time, are already vegetarian or vegan, and some of them cite ethical considerations as the reasons for their practice. At the end of the unit or semester, a small number of students might tell you that they have decided to become vegetarian or vegan because of the arguments discussed in class. Many, perhaps most, students remain unpersuaded. They are resistant to the idea that animals have relatively high moral status, a status that would make the practices under discussion objectionable. Somewhere in between, there are those students that let you know that they find the arguments compelling, that they should become vegetarian or vegan, but they won't or aren't going to because "it's hard" or "meat tastes so good."

T.J. Kasperbauer's book can be read as an attempt to explain why the efforts of animal ethicists haven't been more successful, why our students and the world at large seem so resistant to recognize the moral status of animals or to move to treat them in a way that is commensurate with that status. The book is ambitious and wide-ranging, taking up empirical and philosophical issues in evolutionary and moral psychology, moral responsibility, and applied ethics.

Though the book is not so divided, it is easy to read it as having two parts. In the first part, chapters 2-4, Kasperbauer develops and defends a view about our psychological profile as it regards animals -- a view about how we as humans are characteristically psychologically disposed towards non-human animals in terms of attitudes, dispositions, and beliefs. In chapters 5-8, he turns towards the ethical implications of this characteristic psychological profile, first attempting to show that it is not so easily overcome and then explaining what this means for our ethical obligations, for traditional philosophical views about moral improvement in our treatment of animals, and our attempts to alter our practices regarding non-human animals.

What is our psychological profile regarding animals? How are we typically psychologically disposed to view animals, to attribute moral importance to them, to relate them to humans and to non-human animals, to view them as things due concern, care, compassion, disgust, anger, or fear? Kasperbauer urges us to resist thinking that this psychological profile can be simply characterized, that animals, as a whole or species in particular, can be seen as something we have either only positive or negative attitudes about or to which a single attitude, say fear, is appropriate.

One reason for this is that the evolutionary forces that shaped our attitudes were multidimensional. Chapter 2 paints a picture of the various evolutionary relationships our ancestors bore to animals and some of what we might expect given the direction of various selective forces that arise from these relationships. Since, historically, we relate to animals as both predator and prey, and because animals are vectors for disease, there is adaptive pressure that favors a negative evaluative attitude towards animals. However, there are benefits to having certain relationships with certain animals. Domestication and pet-keeping were adaptive for our ancestors and so we can expect that evolution shaped us to be disposed to view (certain) animals positively.

However, as Kasperbauer makes plain, the environment and the ways in which relationships to non-human animals affect fitness is only one piece of the equation when trying to understand our psychological profile as it regards non-human animals: we need to know more about the psychological mechanisms (ours and our ancestors') that yield our dispositions, attitudes, and beliefs. Here, Kasperbauer draws on research concerning the psychological process of dehumanization -- in particular a specific version of this process called infrahumanization -- and the psychological phenomena described by Threat Management Theory. The picture that he paints is one on which animals are not only a physical threat to humans but also a psychological threat because they remind us of our mortality and force us to question our superiority. Because of the threats animals pose, in particular the psychological threat, it would have been adaptive for our ancestors to have some mechanism for suppressing these threats. This is where the process of infrahumanization comes into play. Infrahumanization is a process by which we recognize some individuals or a class of individuals as having certain human properties while denying them to others. This has the psychological effect of placing these individuals at the border of an in-group. For Kasperbauer, this process of infrahumanization explains how we came to manage the threats raised by animals and ultimately why we bring some animals almost fully into our lives -- he draws on the fact that, for example, we see dogs as family members but might be hesitant to allow them in our bed.

Before turning to the moral lessons that Kasperbauer thinks follow from these chapters on our psychological profile, I'd like to sound a minor critical note. I set aside any concerns about the studies or sample sizes used to support claims about our psychological profile and the psychological mechanisms that allow us to live among animals in the way that we do, but readers should be warned that in some cases they may have to put in some cognitive labor to see how exactly some study supports the conclusion it is adduced to support. Furthermore, there is some inconsistency in the depth with which empirical studies are described. Sometimes the reader is given a full picture of how an experiment was conducted, while other times details are lacking; and in yet other instances conclusions are supported with just a citation. This is a minor complaint but a relevant one for those that are hoping this might serve as literature review or provide a self-contained survey of the relevant psychology literature. That said, the citations are extremely useful, and the discussion of dehumanization and Threat Management Theory are fascinating, even if I didn't end up feeling confident in the picture -- such is often the case when trying to draw specific lessons from our evolutionary history and psychological theories that are very much in dispute.

Chapters 5-8 are as wide-ranging and as ambitious as the chapters dedicated to our psychological profile. Kasperbauer is careful to take up the most important sources of skepticism about his project: "So what if our psychological profile is such and such, we are capable of moral change!"; "Fine, I'm psychologically disposed to discount animals mental states, their moral status, etc., but unless it's impossible to change, this means little for animal ethics!"; "Whatever our dispositions, there is evidence all around us that we are overcoming them and coming to appreciate the moral status of animals and give them their due!" Each of these concerns is addressed in depth. Chapter 5 surveys the sources of our moral failure, including the ways in which morally irrelevant contextual factors play a significant role in determining behavior and the problem of ego depletion and self-control. Chapter 6 takes up the relationship between 'ought implies can' and our psychological profile. Here, Kasperbauer develops criteria of psychological plausibility that he takes to serve as a constraint on ethical theorizing. Chapter 7 takes up the purported evidence of social progress on animal issues, challenging the claim that there is evidence that we have made progress in overcoming our psychological profile. Finally, in Chapter 8, Kasperbauer gives us his vision of how we can utilize what we know about our moral psychology not only to develop psychologically plausible views about the ethics of animals, but also, taking advantage of our knowledge, to help us realize those better-informed ethical outcomes.

Each of these chapters is philosophically rich, controversial, and worthy of a careful reading and response. Take for example Kasperbauer's views about psychological plausibility as a constraint on an ethical theory. According to him, ethicists defending or developing ethical principles should be constrained by the criterion: "Impact: An ethical theory is psychologically plausible if the ideas it promotes are capable of having the intended psychological effect on currently existing human beings" (p. 125). Impact, as well as his other criteria for psychological plausibility, embodies Kasperbauer's commitment to the idea that ethical and normative theorizing should not focus on what is possible for particular agents but instead on what is possible for beings that fit the average or typical psychological profile of members of our species (or some select group of such members). As he puts it in chapter 1: "Rather than ask what individuals should do, ethics should ask what psychologically similar groups of humans should do" (p. 9).

I'm skeptical about the particular constraints proposed as well as the more general view about whose psychological profile (the collective's vs the individual's) is relevant to moral theorizing. With respect to Impact, for example, I'm not sure I can tell what ideas a theory promotes or whether they have the intended psychological effects. Take Hedonistic Utilitarianism. I suppose that, trivially, this theory promotes the idea that an act is right if and only if it maximizes hedonistic welfare, but beyond that I am not sure how I would test its psychological plausibility. If it turns out that people can't actually believe in Hedonistic Utilitarianism, then it seems simply to follow that the theory doesn't promote the idea that people should adopt the view. So, does Hedonistic Utilitarianism satisfy Impact? Furthermore, consider that there is a bit of a Duhem-Quine problem here: let's say that it follows from my endorsing the conjunction of some deontological principles and some principle of the moral equality of humans and non-human animals, that my views promote the idea that people ought not eat meat. It turns out, let's say, that the relevant psychological effects necessary to achieve this aren't possible for currently existing humans. Impact is not satisfied, but we don't know which theory is psychologically implausible.

With respect to Kasperbauer's more general view that our average psychological profile should in some sense constrain ethical theorizing, it seems that those with more orthodox views have the resources to resist any such move. We already have a distinction between theories of right action and theories of excuse. We also recognize that normative theories are prescriptive only for agents whose behaviors can be understood as "acts" in a technical sense. Those who prefer the traditional picture of normative theories can readily admit that the psychological profile can be a source of excuse or limit the extent of their agency. When individuals are found to be incompetent to stand trial, for example, they are (and should be) treated differently than they would be otherwise, and this is so even if (and precisely because) their psychological profile or capacities are in some way far from the average for our species. It seems to count against Kasperbauer's preferred view that such individuals might be judged responsible because the standard we are encouraged to deploy focuses on the group rather than the individual.

None of these concerns are intended to be decisive. Instead, I hope they highlight the ways in which a reader might engage with the book. It is possible to engage critically with Kasperbauer's gloss on the empirical findings, with his views about how those findings inform our psychological profile, and with the reimagining of what ethics should be about. Because the book is so wide-ranging, there is something for everyone, and skepticism about one element of the project doesn't necessarily threaten the rest. For example, even though I'm skeptical that I should think any differently about normative theorizing, I can accept that there are better tools than laying out careful philosophical arguments for achieving the ethical aims of animal advocates and we can draw on resources developed in the book to achieve those ends.