Subjective Time: The Philosophy, Psychology, and Neuroscience of Temporality

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Valtteri Arstila and Dan Lloyd (eds.), Subjective Time: The Philosophy, Psychology, and Neuroscience of Temporality, MIT Press, 2014, 668pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262019941.

Reviewed by Michael Pelczar, National University of Singapore


We use the language of time to describe various aspects of our mental lives. We also use temporal language to describe non-conscious features of the world, such as ordinary objects and events. In one way or another, each of the essays in this volume attempts to make sense of the relationship between these two practices.

As its subtitle suggests, the papers come from a wide range of disciplines. There are contributions from history, cognitive science, clinical psychology, philosophy of mind, metaphysics -- there is even a chapter by a professional magician. With thirty chapters totalling 650 pages, there can be no question here of providing detailed commentary on every paper. Instead, I will focus on the volume's philosophical content, drawing out connections between the explicitly philosophical papers and the psychological papers where possible. This slant implies no judgement on the relative value of the different parts; it just reflects the fact that the reviewer is a philosopher rather than a psychologist (or magician).

The book divides informally into three parts. The first (the first four chapters) contains papers on the history of debates about subjective time. The second (chapters 5 through 7, as well as parts of chapters 8 through 11) contains papers about the temporal phenomenology of conscious experience. The rest of the book consists mainly of papers that explore the conditions under which various subjects (human as well as non-human) judge perceived events to occur simultaneously or in succession, and if in succession, in which order.

As one might expect, the historical chapters revolve around William James and Edmund Husserl. (Chapter 1 is an excerpt from James' Principles of Psychology; chapter 3 is a translation of a paper by Husserl, "The Structure of Lived Time.") Since subsequent chapters contain frequent references to James and Husserl, it is fitting that the volume should begin this way.

For me, the most eye-opening part of these historical chapters was the revelation (in Holly Andersen's contribution) that both James and Husserl drew heavily, and largely without attribution, from the Scottish Common Sense tradition, especially the work of Shadworth Hollway Hodgson (who?). Apparently, Husserl's The Phenomenology of Inner Time Consciousness essentially reproduces the first volume of Hodgson's Metaphysic of Experience. Andersen does not accuse Husserl of plagiarism, which is prudent, given the peculiar circumstances surrounding the publication of Husserl's Phenomenology, but one cannot escape the feeling that Hodgson has not received the credit he deserves.

However we sort out the question of attribution, I agree with Ian Phillips (the author of chapter 7) that it's probably time to put these early figures behind us. It's not just that the useful ideas of James, Husserl, et al. have been thoroughly digested by now. The problem is that these seminal writings are flawed by an infectious unclarity. Many an otherwise lucid discussion of subjective time turns turbid when the author tries to relate what he is saying to James or Husserl; this happens more than once in the volume. We should be grateful to those early pioneers for starting the conversation, but we shouldn't feel compelled to continue it on their terms.

Moving on to the philosophical chapters, we come first to an essay by Shaun Gallagher and Dan Zahavi, who argue for an "enactive" theory of perception, and relate that theory to Husserl's views on time-consciousness. To summarize: it's convenient to think of any given experience as a complex of three simpler experiences: a past-oriented "retention," a present-oriented "primal impression," and a future-oriented "protention." But that doesn't account for the temporality of experience, since every human experience, including every retention, primal impression, and protention also exhibits phenomenal temporality, and therefore can also be thought of as having the same three-part structure. What all this talk about retentions etc. is really getting at is the fact that each of our experiences is both (1) an experience of the world as presenting an opportunity for personal engagement, and (2) an experience of the fulfillment or non-fulfillment of one or more opportunities for such engagement. That's why each of our experiences is an experience as of the contents of some interval of time, rather than a durationless instant. But this still doesn't give us an analysis of phenomenal temporality, since the opportunity and fulfillment aspects of an experience are also characterized by phenomenal temporality, and therefore by further perceived opportunities for engagement and fulfillment (or unfulfillment), and so on ad infinitum. Thus human experience has an essentially fractal structure.

I had some trouble finding my legs in this chapter. Partly this was because I was often unsure whether its purpose was to defend the enactive theory, or to shed light on Husserl's writings. In the end I took it as an attempt to establish the Husserlian credentials of the enactive theory. In this, I think it succeeds.

The next two chapters (6 and 7) are by Barry Dainton and Ian Phillips, respectively. For this reviewer, these were the most rewarding chapters in the book.

First, some background. In his writings on subjective time, Dainton has drawn an influential distinction between "extensional" and "retentional" theories. Retentionalists hold that an experience of duration or change is confined to single moment of objective time, while extensionalists hold that some experiences of duration or change comprise multiple briefer experiences occurring in objective temporal succession.

The great advantage of extensionalism over retentionalism is its facilitation of Dainton's "overlap" theory of the stream of consciousness, according to which a stream consists of a series of conscious experiences each of which has some of its experiential phases (or temporal parts) in common with nearby experiences in the stream. Obviously, this theory works only on the assumption that many of our experiences comprise briefer successive experiences -- otherwise, no experience could have experiential temporal parts in common with another experience. Dainton's theory of the stream of consiousness is, in my opinion, by far the best that the literature has to offer. This makes its dependence on an extensional theory of phenomenal change a powerful argument for the latter.

In his chapter, Dainton addresses a perceived threat to the extensional theory, in the form of an argument that some experiences of duration lack successive experiential phases. It's hard to see what the threat is, though. After all, the italicized claim is compatible with the view that some experiences of duration have successive experiential phases, which is all that the overlap theory of the stream of consciousness requires. Evidently Dainton thinks that there are independent reasons to reject the italicized claim -- reasons that have nothing to do with the stream of consciousness. What might these be?

One possible concern is that an objectively durationless experience couldn't possibly exhibit phenomenal duration. But the claim that some experiences of duration lack successive experiential phases does not entail that any experience lacks objective duration. A conscious experience might endure over some period of time, and even consist of a temporal sequence of events (e.g., brain-events), without consisting of any temporal succession of conscious experiences.

That said, if we accept the italicized claim, we may find ourselves pushed to the more extreme claim that some phenomenally enduring experiences lack objective duration. This is a claim that Dainton clearly wants to resist, but to me it's unclear why. To begin with, it's not at all obvious that phenomenal duration requires objective duration. The experience I have when I bite into a lemon is phenomenally sour; from this, I don't infer that the experience is objectively sour (sour in the same sense as the lemon itself). So why should I infer from the fact that my experience of the lemon is phenomenally enduring that the experience has some objective duration?

A different concern relates to the fact that if some experiences are objectively durationless, then presumably all of our most basic experiences are objectively durationless. In that case, each of the complex overlapping experiences that make up a Daintonian stream of consciousness is a temporal sequence of durationless experiences. In order for a stream to have any significant objective duration, the durationless experiences that make up a complex experience would have to be separated by intervals of time devoid of any experience (or at least, devoid of any experience belonging to the subject of that complex experience).

But why should this be considered a problem? Maybe the fear is that an experience consisting of briefer experiences separated by experienceless intervals would have to be an experience as of a gappy state of affairs, in which successive events are separated by gulfs of empty time. That would indeed be a problem, since few, if any, of our experiences are like that. But the fear is unfounded. An experience that contains objective temporal gaps need not be an experience of a gappy sequence of events; to suppose otherwise would be to confuse an absence of experience with an experience of absence.

On the whole, then, Dainton seems to address a threat to extensionalism that doesn't really exist. But even if he is tilting at windmills here, he displays some excellent horsemanship in the process, and his contribution is well worth studying.

The chapter by Phillips is also very good. According to Phillips, the proper starting point for any discussion about time and experience is the question of how the objective temporal features of experience relate to the subjective temporal features of that which is (apparently) experienced. He defends the "naive view" that the relation is one of identity, or at least proportionality: "our experience inherits the temporal structure of the events which are its contents" (142).

Phillips' main goal is to defend the naive view against various psychological experiments that are often thought to tell against it. One such, the so-called "cutaneous rabbit" experiment, begins with a subject receiving five taps at the same place on his wrist. The subject reports feeling five taps on his wrist. Next, the subject receives five wrist taps quickly followed by five taps at a point halfway between wrist and elbow, followed by five taps near the elbow. In this case, the subject typically reports feeling a succession of evenly-spaced taps starting at his wrist and ending near his elbow.

According to one analysis of the experiment, subjects in both scenarios feel five taps on the wrist -- it's just that subjects in the second scenario quickly forget all but one of those taps, and misremember the remaining four as occurring at various points farther up the arm (and likewise for the other taps). Phillips finds this account to be inconsistent with the naive view of subjective time.

According to another analysis of the experiment, there is a time-lag following the initial tapping stimuli, which allows the brain to take into account subsequent stimuli before generating a conscious experience (either of five taps at the wrist, or of a sequence of taps running up the arm). This account is compatible with the naive view, but, according to Phillips, implausible.

Phillips argues that a better way for the naive theorist to fend off the cutaneous rabbit is by understanding experiences -- even the simplest ones -- as temporal series of non-experiential events (such as sequences of neural firings). Instead of thinking of the running-up-the-arm sensation as something that gets generated at some moment following the start of the experiment, we can think of it as something that exists as a temporally extended whole bounded by the temporal endpoints of the experiment. An analogy might be a game of chess, which occupies some interval of time, even though no moment of that interval is such that its contents are sufficient for a game of chess.

It seems to me that Phillips' defense of naivety against the cutaneous rabbit and similar threats is effective, provided that we are willing to accept that all of our experiences, including our simplest experiences, are diachronic complexes of non-experiential events (or instantiations of qualia by such complexes). Whether we ought to grant the proviso is another question, which falls outside the ambit of Phillips' discussion (and this review).

It also seems likely that Phillips is right that the naive view, or something like it, is the best account of the relationship between the subjective and objective temporal features of experience, assuming that experience has objective temporal features -- an assumption that is practically universal among parties to these debates (though not shared by me). But the reasons Phillips gives in support of the assumption are not very convincing. He insists on a disanalogy between phenomenal duration, succession, and change on one hand, and, on the other, qualities like phenomenal shape, color, and flavor, and suggests that this weighs in favor of the naive view. No doubt there is a disanalogy on the naive view -- remember the lemony experience discussed earlier -- but it's hard to see how this is a point in favor of naivety. If anything, the fact that naivety requires us to see phenomenal time as fundamentally different from all other phenomenal properties would seem to be a reason to regard the naive view with suspicion.

One thing that makes Phillips' chapter particularly interesting is that it has a clear connection with some of the volume's later psychological chapters. Many of those chapters argue that the neural activity that lies behind our experiences of things happening (or, as the case may be, not happening) over time are far more complicated and heterogeneous than the phenomenology of the experiences would suggest. This by itself does not pose any threat to Phillips' naive theory, which posits a rough isomorphism between the subjective temporal structure of an experience and the objective temporal structure of the experience's target (or apparent target), which is not (typically) the neural correlate of the experience. But if the neural processing underlying our experiences is the crazy-quilt that the psychologists suggest, it is natural to wonder how much of the objective temporal structure of that which sets the processing in motion is likely to survive in the experiences to which the processing gives rise.

For reasons explained earlier, I don't have much more to say about the psychological chapters (of which my favorite was probably the one by John Wearden et al.). For me, the main take-home message of these chapters was that at present, we really don't know all that much about the psychology or neuroscience of time perception. (In fact, this is explicitly presented as the take-home message of most of these chapters.)

I should mention that most of the empirically-oriented chapters are written as literature reviews. Since it is much the same literature being reviewed in each case, there is a certain amount of redundancy among them. Chronostasis gets explained twice, prospective versus retrospective timing tasks four times, the peak interval procedure four times, the distinction between temporal order tasks and simultaneity tasks five times, and bisection tasks five times. The cutaneous rabbit experiment is described twice, Dennett's "multiple drafts model" thrice, and the pacemaker-accumulator account of internal timing at least five times. Some more aggressive editing might have shortened this part of the volume without detracting from its scholarly value.

I learned something from this book, and I suspect that psychologists working on subjective time and experimentally-oriented philosophers will learn even more from it. It may not break much new ground, but it should serve as a useful sourcebook for anyone interested in the highly interdisciplinary study of subjective time.