Subjects of the World: Darwin's Rhetoric and the Study of Agency in Nature

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Paul Sheldon Davies, Subjects of the World: Darwin's Rhetoric and the Study of Agency in Nature, U of Chicago Press, 2009, 259pp., $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226137629.

Reviewed by Paolo Costa, Fondazione Bruno Kessler, Trento



It is no news that naturalism is the dominant philosophical position in the English-speaking world. One of the clearest signs of this hegemony is the battle now raging around its purest and most consistent interpretation and the gradual spread of a “holier than thou” attitude that, at first sight, should be a distinctive feature of ideological battles rather than of intellectual discussions. The book by Paul Sheldon Davies is a self-confessed move in this direction. It starts off with a controversial interpretation of the nature and aims of Darwin’s rhetorical strategy. It goes on articulating a naturalist manifesto or, better, a list of stringent directives for naturalistic inquiry. And it culminates in a double test of the strength of these directives in light of two of the most intractable philosophical issues of all times: teleology and free will.

The first chapter (“The Vividness of Truth: Darwin’s Romantic Rhetoric and the Evolutionary Framework”) is a good example of the selective uses of Darwin that nobody seems to be able to avoid in this endless Darwin Year. Starting from Darwin’s generic hostility toward the “cramped imagination” of creationists, Davies describes the English naturalist as a shrewd rhetorician strongly preoccupied by “the biasing effects [of] our creationist intuitions or expectations” (7). Overlooking his often relaxed attitude towards anthropomorphism and, more generally, towards modern epistemological taboos, Davies portrays Darwin as eagerly intent on neutralizing the “ill effects of our own frailties” by “pointing to specific failures of imagination”: a champion of cold and abstract reason against the snares of senses and imagination (226, 8). In Davies’ words: "It is as if Darwin asked himself, ‘What are the most entrenched habits of thought and most entrenched cognitive and affective dispositions likely to inhibit a correct understanding of my theory?’" (5).

But all this talk of “neutralizing”, “controlling” and “compensating” does not seem to agree with Darwin’s taste for speculation or, as he loved to say in his Notebooks, for building “castles in the air”. Instead of an easy and trusting reliance upon the power of human senses and thought, there is plenty of a long-established hyper-reflective Cartesian suspicion toward the “biasing effects of our cultural ancestry” in Davies’ account (17). His view is that “we have only the sparest knowledge of what is going on in our own psychologies because reliable, conscious access to our own capacities is paltry”, and, to add insult to injury, that “we are blissfully unaware of just how unaware we are” (11).

Thus, given that we do not even imagine how inadequate our self-knowledge is, any view of human agency based upon common sense or intuition ought to be looked upon with disbelief and suspicion. Nay, more than that. It should be regarded with the contempt that any idea destined for the dustbin of history deserves. According to Davies, even though “we do not know in any substantive sense what kind of agents we are”, “we do know with overwhelming confidence what kind of agents we are not” (225, 20). This does not only entail a full rejection of “all theological inquiry” (embodied in the book by a poor, mistreated Reinhold Niebuhr), but also of “our Enlightenment and Romantic predecessors”, in short, everyone born before the twentieth century (with the notable exception of Charles Darwin) (20).

The “central target” of the second chapter (“Our Most Vexing Problem: Conceptual Conservatism and Conceptual Imperialism”), therefore, “is the default assumption of all theological and most philosophical reflection”, i.e. the idea that "with respect to the most central features of being human, we begin the process of inquiry already knowing what we are like" (23, 22-23). (Davies has obviously no patience with the Hegelian distinction between what is bekannt, simply familiar, and what is erkannt, systematically known.) Since even “some of our most naturalistically inclined theorists nevertheless fall back upon this assumption at crucial points in their reflections”, it is essential to "suggest strategies for finally eradicating the residual theology that retards the progress of human knowledge" (24; italics mine). It is, then, “conceptual conservatism” vs. “conceptual progressivism” and “conceptual imperialism” (“a commitment to the view that certain concepts have a right among and dominion over all other concepts and all methods of inquiry”, 26) vs. “theoretical anti-imperialism” or “robust naturalism”. On one side, a lot of intellectual energy is spent in a vain attempt to save the phenomena, i.e. “to integrate our humanistic self-understanding with our emerging and evolving scientific view of the world” — what Davies dubs as the “concept location project” — on the other side, the possession of "a growing body of knowledge concerning the habits of thought and dispositions of mind that retard human inquiry" engenders a strong hope of throwing some light on the “hard issues” in the near future (23, 34).

So, naturalism is the answer, according to Davies. And not so much naturalism as a “metaphysical thesis”, but naturalism as a method of inquiry ruled by a coherent set of directives (36). What kind of directives? Some of them are uncontroversial “rules of thumb”, such as the ones that call for descriptive accuracy or theoretical competition (52). But others, in fact, conceal a disputed substantive view behind a list of methodological guidelines. Some do this by elevating a highly revisionary notion of epistemic progress to the general rule of the life of the mind (“For systems we understand poorly or not at all, expect that, as inquiry progresses, the concepts in terms of which we conceptualize high-level systemic capacities will be altered or eliminated”). Others plainly urge us to explain away concepts “dubious by decent” or by “psychological role”. Still others pass off a particular conception of mind as a seemingly neutral methodological injunction (Anticipatory Systemic Function: “For any psychological capacity of any minded organism, expect that among its most prominent systemic functions is the function of anticipating some feature of the organism’s environment”; Nonconscious mechanism: “For any conscious capacity of mind, expect that we will correctly understand that capacity only if we (1) frame our inquiry with plausible assumptions concerning our evolutionary history; (2) formulate competing hypotheses concerning the affective or cognitive capacities involved, and (3) analyze inward and synthesize laterally until we discover low-level, nonconscious, anticipatory mechanisms implementing the hypothesized capacities”).

In Davies’ view, then, progress in knowledge implies a significant amount of disenchantment. So it comes as no surprise that the main goal of the second and third parts of his book is to dispel or, better, to eradicate whatever “allure” or “illusion” is left in human agency by scientific advancement. Davies’ philosophical radicalism is in plain view from the opening lines of the fourth chapter (“The Real Heart of Darwinian Evolutionary Biology”), where he boldly argues: “With one exception, all contemporary theories of biological functions or natural purposes are unacceptably conservative or imperialistic” (55). Accordingly, Michael Ruse’s defense of the usefulness of the metaphor of design is dismissed as another lame product of “conceptual conservatism”. Even the seemingly unassailable naturalistic credentials of the theory of proper functions are rejected as “fraudulent” (82). Why? Because the view championed by Ruth Millikan, among others, still admits of “noncausal, nonmechanical properties”, carving out an ontological residual niche for independent ideal norms (84). But, in Davies’ opinion, there is nothing ideal or “normative” in the brutal evolutionary project: “Evolutionary theory describes causal processes and mechanisms that help explain the perpetuation of some forms of life and the eventual failure of all forms of life” (87). Consequently, we should beware of not falling prey to the allure of another (intellectually and psychologically) dubious concept: “self-perpetuation”. Organisms are nothing but “a centerless ensemble of causal factors”, “all is contingent” and "the human form and all the other forms we encounter are the fleeting effects of recurring ensembles of scattered causal factors, and only the most obstinate failure of historical imagination could make us think otherwise" (99, italics mine).

But, such being the case, why is the teleological frame of mind so hard to eradicate? The reason is twofold: historical and psychological. While teleological concepts are “perpetuated by the conservative effects of culturally transmitted conceptual schemes” — our theological legacy — this “cultural staying power” is, in its turn, “a more or less direct consequence of our psychological constitution” that drives us mistakenly to attribute purposes and functions to things and beings which are not purposive in any sense of the word (104). Our conscious attributions of purpose are therefore a delusion, however deeply entrenched in our psychology. The end result is somewhat paradoxical, as the author himself points out in a side-remark concerning autism. As is well-known, “autistic children tend not to conceptualize objects in their environment in mental terms; they tend not to conceptualize persons as things with minds”. We nonautistics, on the contrary, are “naïve realists concerning the existence of other minds” (117). But naïve realism is the Ur-mistake for Davies. So it appears that autistics are right and normal people are wrong as far as our attitude towards the other beings is concerned (this seems to reveal something about people in the academy or in laboratories, but I cannot further investigate the matter now).

In the third part of the book, Davies moves an additional step further in the disenchanting process, demolishing another idol of the conceptual “conservatives”: free will. His argument proceeds along these (now predictable) lines:

the scientific study of the human mind, including the study of our experiences as agents, has changed dramatically the way we understand the reliability of our-first-person experiences. The traditional antagonism between our humanistic and scientific worldviews is no longer a struggle between equally powerful opponents (139).

But since the idea of free will ultimately rests only on the illusions caused by our deep psychological mechanisms, we have to admit that we are not the free and responsible authors of our actions we thought we were or, to use a peculiar expression of the writer, that “we are not little Thomistic gods” (193). In brief, we currently do not know what we are, but we certainly are not free.

This line of reasoning is consistent with a long-established modern (skeptical) tradition, which moves from a (specific) puzzlement about ourselves and results in a global refusal of a picture of our nature that is well-founded at first sight:

If we know that sometimes our feeling of authorship is an illusion, and if from the first-person perspective we cannot distinguish illusions of authorship from actual authorship, then we cannot justifiably claim to know in any given case whether we, by virtue of our conscious thought or intentions, actually authored our own action (165).

But starting from an inflated view of freedom (“today we can no longer accept that the human will is akin to the will of God”, 29), it is all too easy to get rid of the much more nuanced human experience of agency. So, while Davies has no difficulty in pointing out the patent weaknesses of libertarianism, he seems unable to understand the gist and philosophical scope of the compatibilist position. Since there lies the book’s main theoretical flaw, it is worthwhile devoting the last lines of this review to better articulating the point.

Davies is surely right in choosing Peter Strawson as his main antagonist here, but for the wrong reasons, for what is crucial in Strawson’s view is the distinction between several varieties of naturalism and his willingness to live with them. Underlying this “liberal” attitude there is the idea that, when we are confronted with the ultimate metaphysical quandaries, we have to give up “the unreal project of wholesale validation” (see his Scepticism and Naturalism, p. 22). Our global images of ourselves are not bound to stand or fall upon a single (or even multiple, for that matter) empirical counter-example, because there is plainly no way to contrive a fully transparent language or a pure, non-metaphorical conceptual apparatus in order to think through the whole of our life. The only (admittedly supple) criterion in these matters is our reflective equilibrium, where empirical data, interpretations and compelling images converge as closely as possible to a philosophical truth that, to quote Strawson again, is

so complex and many-sided, so multi-faced, that any individual philosopher’s work, if it is to have any unity and coherence, must at best emphasize some aspects of the truth, to the neglect of others which may strike another philosopher with greater force (ibid., p. viii).

This is surely the case when it comes to such fundamental philosophical issues as free will or teleological explanation.

Seen in this light, Davies’ book is a shining example of militant naturalistic rhetoric, rather than as providing a convincing case for a stricter and monopolistic (I would be tempted to say “imperialistic”) variety of naturalism. This may help explain the unexpected religious overtones of Davies’ prose and his continuous reference to the “weaknesses”, “frailties”, “biases”, “infirmities” of our (fallen?) nature and especially his relentless admonition not to be led “astray” (I counted seventeen occurrences of the term).

At one point in the book, Davies bluntly states:

Just as the production of new life necessitates the incessant destruction of life, so the drive toward greater knowledge necessitates the destruction of past conceptual categories. The thought that the concepts of our theological ancestors ought to be preserved, when seen from the point of view of a progressive orientation, is itself a thought that ought to be eradicated. It is far too pernicious to be retained. Inquiry is for explorers, not taxidermists. It is a sure bet that we have turned our backs on genuine inquiry when we find ourselves gauging the goodness of our conclusions by the degree of comfort they provide (75, italics mine).

Even apart from the worn-out Weberian conclusion, this seems too much to swallow. If Davies really likes Darwin’s humble and understanding attitude towards the world, he must know that in our clumsy attempts to investigate reality there is plenty of room for both taxidermy and bold speculation, good theological thought and humdrum laboratory work. And in this thick, complex and superabundant world there also has to be some space for free will — a point that should sound obvious to anyone who has just struggled to bring a book to an end!