Spinoza on Philosophy, Religion, and Politics: The Theologico-Political Treatise

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Susan James, Spinoza on Philosophy, Religion, and Politics: The Theologico-Political Treatise, Oxford University Press, 2012, 348pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199698127.

Reviewed by Yitzhak Y. Melamed, The Johns Hopkins University


Spinoza's Tractatus Theologico Politicus appeared anonymously in 1670. The identity of the author became known shortly after its publication, and the work made Spinoza one of the most notorious spirits hovering under the skies of Europe. To this very day, Spinoza retains his reputation as an iconoclast. Yet, in spite of the great interest and respect Spinoza's metaphysics has recently gained among analytic philosophers, his political philosophy has failed to achieve any such esteem. Prima facie, this may seem quite surprising, since Spinoza's political theory is far bolder, and arguably more sophisticated, than that of Hobbes or Locke. But the reasons for this neglect are not difficult to pin down. First, you have Spinoza's ironic style and habit of writing between the lines, which make it somewhat hard to rephrase his claims by "if and only if" formulae (though I would not assign much weight to this issue). Then, you have the seizure of the discourse on Spinoza's political philosophy by Leo Strauss and his crowd during the 1970s and 1980s. Typically, Strauss turned Spinoza into an Athenian in Jerusalemite garb, and presented him as attempting to employ the masses in the service of the secret elites. While Strauss was right to stress the multi-layered style in Spinoza's writing (a style that was quite transparent to Spinoza's contemporaries), he reduced Spinoza's claims to a childish game of secret societies and a gross dichotomy between faith and reason.

Over the past two decades there has been a somewhat opposite trend, and some scholars have attempted to turn Spinoza into a late twentieth-century liberal democrat, advocating separation of church and state, freedom of expression, and even gender equality. I will spare the reader a listing of the absurdities of this view, but let me just suggest that Spinoza's political thought may not fit well into our categories. Spinoza clearly has some conservative tendencies (he was strongly averse to any political upheavals), yet other elements in his theory anticipate Marxist and Nietzschean views (such as the identification of right and power, namely, the view of morality as a superstructure grounded in power relations).

Against this background, Susan James's new book is a fresh and welcome contribution. Essentially, it is an attempt to explicate and contextualize the Theologico-Political Treatise. James's style is elegant, and her reading of Spinoza's text is both perceptive and thorough. The twelve chapters of her book follow the order of the topics discussed in the twenty chapters of the TTP (roughly one book chapter per two chapters of the TTP). In her introduction, James explains her methodology by pointing out that "in order to follow Spinoza, and to grasp the significance of his claims, it is not enough to explicate the text: one must also set it in the context of the sequence of theological and political debates to which he is contributing" (4). Though not myself a card-carrying member of the contextualist school, I believe that at least in the case of the TTP this attitude is quite fruitful and apt for a rather simple reason. The most salient feature of the text (as James points out) is its polemical nature, and it is hard to grasp the full meaning of a claim made as part of a debate when that claim is abstracted from its setting. Obviously, this interpretative attitude makes the decision about the proper context for understanding the book utterly critical.

James views the TTP as a book targeting primarily late seventeenth-century conservative Dutch Calvinism, and she is clearly right. The rhetorical devices Spinoza employs in the book make clear that its intended audience is neither Jews nor Catholics. But James interestingly suggests that, in spite of this historical grounding, the book should not be read merely as an "active theological-political intervention in the politics of its time," but also as a work which "yields insights of general philosophical interest, bearing on our own predicament as much as that of the Dutch state in the second half of the seventeenth century" (6). Indeed, recent events both in Europe and in the United States show that many of the problems addressed in Spinoza's book are still with us. Consider, for example, the recent decision in Switzerland (presumably a modern, liberal state) to ban the building of minarets, or the even more recent court ruling in Germany prohibiting circumcision.

In explicating the claims of the TTP, James weaves in many additional texts: Spinoza's Ethics and letters, the works of other early modern political and religious theorists (such as Calvin, Grotius, Hobbes, Voetius, and Cunaeus), and classical sources. The fact that James hardly ever discusses Spinoza's Political Treatise -- a work written just a few years after the publication of the TTP and addressing many of the same issues -- is salient. Presumably, James wished to secure the historical integrity of the TTP, but since she does address the Ethics (which was published simultaneously with the Political Treatise in 1677), this practice is somewhat surprising.

One of the impressive features of the book is its erudition. James discusses numerous contemporary sources, by both major and minor figures, in a manner that truly illuminates Spinoza's claims. But it is precisely against this background that James's discussion of Jewish and biblical sources is quite disappointing. About three-quarters of the TTP addresses the nature and authority of the Bible (in the rest of the book Spinoza presents his political theory and his views on the relation between church and state). Thus, it is simply impossible to analyze the Treatise adequately without a proper understanding of the biblical text and its hermeneutic history.

Regrettably, James's book contains many factual errors when addressing these issues (most of these errors could have been picked up by a good editor). For example, she writes that in 1666 "a charismatic Ashkenazi Jew from Smyrna called Shabbetai Zevi had arrived in Amsterdam" (41), even though Shabbetai Zevi was not Ashkenazi, nor did he ever set a foot in Amsterdam, or anywhere west of Greece. (It is quite intriguing to speculate how dramatically the course of Dutch and western European Jewry might have changed had Shabbetai Zevi traveled to Amsterdam, but this is a mere imaginary exercise). Similarly, James refers to an alleged biblical scene "when Pharaoh tells Daniel" (48), conflating figures from two unrelated narratives. Later she describes how "Isaiah [!] struck a rock with his staff and water flowed out of it" (62) (this confusion is apparently a misreading of Spinoza's comment (III/94) on Isaiah 48:21).

Let me note in passing that errors of this kind (and even worse) are quite common in recent scholarship and even translations of the TTP. Do these errors undermine the scholarly achievement of James's book? Probably not. I did not come across any place where she bases a major interpretative claim on such a mistake. Still, this leaves the reader with an impression that the author's command of the biblical text is unequal to her impressive knowledge of early modern literature. In the case of the TTP, this is an undesirable position, since Spinoza is quite a manipulative and creative interpreter, and without good command of his subject matter one is likely to miss many of the subtleties, ironies, and manipulations of the text.

James is a very sympathetic reader (and also very fair in her treatment of secondary literature). At times I suspect she is a bit too sympathetic. She accepts Spinoza's characterization of his own method of interpreting the Bible as historical (161). I would take this characterization with a grain of salt (if we take "history" to mean anything close to what we currently understand by the term). Take, for example, Spinoza's notion of "the Pharisees," under which he lumps together his contemporaries in the Jewish community of Amsterdam, as well as early rabbinic figures from the fourth century BCE. Can we make sense of such a historical category? Or should we rather say that this category, which is quite significant in the book, belongs to a certain religious discourse?

There are several other issues on which I found myself in disagreement with James. I would, for example, doubt her claim that "the imaginative powers of the prophets . . . enables them to articulate a class of moral truths that are difficult to come by" (63). For Spinoza, the morality preached in the Bible is very simple, and does not require any special talents. The imagination is also not the proper mental capacity for uncovering truths. But, regardless of these disagreements, I would highly recommend James's book. It is a serious and important work in which the author reads Spinoza's text very closely. It uses early modern and classical texts to contextualize Spinoza's work in a very sensitive manner. It is a thoughtful and illuminating work that should become part of the canon of scholarship on Spinoza's Theologico-Political Treatise.