Taking Morality Seriously: A Defense of Robust Realism

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David Enoch, Taking Morality Seriously: A Defense of Robust Realism, Oxford University Press, 2011, 295pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199579969.

Reviewed by Andrew Sepielli, University of Toronto


David Enoch's Taking Morality Seriously is a defense of "robust metanormative realism", or the view that there are "objective, irreducibly normative truths" (p. 4).[1] Realism of a broadly non-naturalist sort has made a huge comeback in recent years -- so huge that it may even be the majority position among normative theorists. This means that Taking Morality Seriously is less brazenly iconoclastic than it would have been had it been published a decade ago. But its novelty is apparent throughout, as it presents creative and ambitious arguments for realism, and uncommonly perspicacious responses to the best arguments against it. It instilled in at least this reader a sense of excitement about what metaethics might look like going forward.

The book consists of 10 chapters: an introduction, a conclusion, three chapters of positive arguments for robust realism, and five chapters worth of responses to objections to it. This review will focus mainly on the positive arguments, but will include at least some summary and evaluation of each of the "response" chapters.

In Chapter 2, Enoch argues that metaethical objectivism is better placed than other theories to explain the propriety of "standing our ground" in moral disputes. For it seems that, in cases of a recognizable sort, interpersonal conflicts due to differences in mere preference call for an "impartial" solution -- one that grants one person's preferences no more weight than another's preferences. Suppose we must decide where to go for a post-conference dinner. If I prefer Chili's and you prefer Applebee's, it seems reasonable to do something like one of the following: go to both, flip a coin, go to Chili's now and Applebee's next year, and so on.

However, it seems that I should not seek an impartial solution in moral conflicts (once we bracket off cases where my own ignorance is quite likely the source of our conflict). Suppose you and I find a stray dog, and must decide what to do with it. I think we should care for it while looking for its owner, and you think we torture it. Here it seems like I should hold fast to my position.

But now notice that, on some non-objectivist metaethical views, moral conflicts are "due to differences in mere preference" in the sense that there are no right answers independently of our preferences. If one of these views were true, then it would be appropriate to seek "impartial" solutions to moral conflicts. Since this is not appropriate, all of the target non-objectivist views must be false.

There's a lot to like about this chapter. Enoch is casting in high relief a way in which certain anti-realist views do seem not to take morality seriously. Even if his argument fails, he is doing a service by showing the parties to the realism/anti-realism debate an important, easily graspable thing they might argue over -- in other words, by giving this debate some teeth.

I have some concerns, though. Enoch errs, I think, in including expressivism among the theories targeted in this chapter. He begins his discussion of expressivism by acknowledging, as he should, that expressivists are not obviously committed to response-dependence about morals. But by the end, we find him attributing to expressivism the claim that "there is a sense in which moral truths and facts are really just a matter of our passions, that it is really we whose feelings explain morality." (p. 38)

However, there are at least two ways to interpret the claim that "[our] feelings explain morality". It might mean: "facts about our feelings or the feelings we would have under other circumstances explain the rightness or wrongness of actions". But this is just the sort of response-dependence many expressivists will immediately balk at.

On the other hand, the claim might mean something like: "facts about the (im)propriety of the feelings that are our moral judgments explain which moral properties are instantiated where, which propositions about morality are true, etc. (rather than the other way around)". We are to "read off" the fact that an action has the property of wrongness from the fact that disapproving of it is proper, rather than reading off the propriety-fact from the property-fact. But then expressivism does not yet imply that nothing outside our feelings may settle a moral conflict. For just as the realist may explain the distribution of moral properties by pointing to non-feeling facts, the expressivist may explain the (im)propriety of moral judgments by adverting to the same. As long as a metaethical view places something other than our feelings or preferences at the bottom of this explanatory pyramid, it is beyond the reach of this chapter's argument, whatever it says about the other layers of the pyramid.

I also have a more general worry about the argument. Enoch acknowledges that the non-objectivist may be able to offer an alternative explanation of why we should stand our ground in moral conflicts. It's just that he doesn't think any such explanation could be satisfactory. I think, though, that he overlooks a promising suggestion. Let us suppose, along with Enoch, that impartial solutions are appropriate in all preferential conflicts. Everyone's interests count, at least presumptively. But I shall want to claim that what counts as an impartial solution depends on whether the conflict is a characteristically moral one or a characteristically non-moral one. For what makes, say, the "dog" conflict a characteristically moral one is just that there is an additional salient party to the conflict besides you and me -- namely, the dog.[2] Since the "torture" position is supported only by your weak interests, while the "seek owner" position is supported by my weak interests plus the dog's extraordinarily strong interests, it would seem that the truly impartial solution is for me to stick to my guns and insist that we seek the dog's owner. Just as the Lorax speaks for the trees, I speak for the dogs, and that adds weight to my urging.

Now, in a footnote (p. 35, n. 32), Enoch gives a reply to a suggestion of Steve Finlay's that would also serve as a reply to my proposed explanation: The moral judgments of someone who wants to torture the dog are no reason at all, says Enoch, to torture it. But impartiality implies that they are such a reason, albeit an outweighed one. So we must reject impartiality in moral conflicts, along with any explanation that relies on it.

Upon further review, though, it's not so obvious that impartiality has this implication. The intuition behind impartiality is, roughly, that everyone matters. But that doesn't mean that all preferences or interests matter. It is an oft-made point that the satisfaction of so-called "offensive tastes" should receive little or no weight (see, e.g., Cohen 1989). So we might explain the normative inertness of your preferences in the "dog" case by saying that they are a kind of offensive taste.[3] By contrast, while your fondness for Applebee's is surely perverse in its own way, it hardly rises to the level of an offensive taste.

In Chapter 3, Enoch presents a kind of "indispensability" argument for robust metanormative realism. Deliberation has a certain phenomenology; it feels, in deliberating, like we're trying to arrive at objectively right answers. So deliberation commits us to believing in objectively right answers to normative questions -- in other words, to objective reasons. In that sense, belief in objective reasons is indispensable to deliberation. Furthermore, deliberation is what Enoch calls a "rationally non-optional project" for creatures like us. That a belief in something is indispensable to a rationally non-optional project is a reason to think that that thing exists. So we have reason to think that there are objective reasons.

Now, the argument that it's rationally required for deliberators to believe in objective reasons is already pretty well-known. But Enoch is adding to the argument in three ways. First, there's a huge gap between its being rational to believe in something, and there being a reason to believe in that thing, and Enoch is offering a way to bridge that gap. Second, in doing so, he's assimilating his indispensability argument to indispensability arguments for numbers, propositions, electrons, and the like -- thereby putting the pressure on those who would even tacitly accept these other arguments to find grounds to reject his. Third, he's just generally presenting the existing argument in a clearer, more tractable way than it's been presented. For these and other reasons, I found this chapter especially rewarding.

However, a few things kept me from being fully persuaded. There are certain types of mental occurrences the "committing potential" of which is very controversial, and the elements of deliberation Enoch focuses on fall under two of these types. It is not clear, first of all, which beliefs we're committed to by phenomenally-characterized events like seemings, appearances, feelings, and the like. Suppose it appears to you that a stick in the water is bent. On its own, this appearance would seem to commit you to the belief that the stick is bent. But if you have the further belief that the appearance is an illusion, then this commitment vanishes entirely. Why not say something similar about the appearance of there being objective reasons? That is, when you deliberate, it appears to you that there are such reasons. But now suppose that, having accepted an argument for normative skepticism, you have the further belief that this appearance is illusory. Then I can't see how you are rationally committed to believing in objective reasons.

Nor is it obvious what we're committed to by mental states part of whose purpose is facilitating action. Suppose it's a condition on my successfully A-ing that P. It has been shown that my confidence in P (on some measure thereof) tends to increase while I am engaged in A-ing, and decrease once I step back and disinterestedly consider whether P (Gollwitzer 1990). These temporary confidence boosts are a good thing, for otherwise almost all of our intentional actions would stall out in the face of uncertainty. But does my confidence in P while A-ing rationally commit me to confidence in P elsewhen? I can't see that it does. We might tell a similar story as a rebuttal to Enoch. It needs to seem to you that there are objective reasons for at least the more thoughtful of your actions to get off the ground. But you haven't been irrational just because this seeming quietly slinks away after its action-facilitating task is completed.

A more fundamental worry: It's not clear that a belief's indispensability to a rationally non-optional project is a reason to think that the belief's object exists. It depends, I think, on what the project's non-optionality consists in. Enoch says very little about the kind of non-optionality that is characteristic of deliberation, offering only a rather sketchy account on which some deliberation is mandatory for us because we are "essentially deliberative creatures". It's natural to think, though, that deliberative indispensability could play an ontology-shaping role only if deliberation's non-optionality implied that it is likely to be hooked up with the world in the right way -- that the world is probably "deliberation-friendly". And Enoch has given us no reason to think that this is the case.

Enoch is aware of this concern. His most satisfying response is to shift the burden to his assumed opponent, the person who accepts explanatory indispensability arguments but wishes to reject deliberative indispensability arguments. The legitimacy of the former depends crucially, he says, on the rational non-optionality of our practice of explanation. And the best account of this non-optionality appeals to our being essentially explaining creatures, not to the "explanation-friendliness" of the world. As Enoch is careful to note, this is not an epistemic justification of explanatory indispensability arguments; he doesn't think they can be so justified. Rather, it is what Enoch calls a "vindication" of them -- something that "presents [them] in a positive light, such that we're happy the account is zeroing in on [their] justificatorily-relevant features" (p. 60). This is all to say that the considerations that legitimize explanatory indispensability arguments are the same as those that legitimize deliberative indispensability arguments. So deliberative indispensability had better shape your ontology if explanatory indispensability does.

But this story prompts some questions. First, why can't we justify the use of explanatory indispensability arguments by appealing to the explanation-friendliness of the world? Enoch's answer: because these arguments are a good candidate for being the most basic sort of ampliative inference; we'd need to use ampliative inference to show that the world is explanation-friendly; and so such an appeal would be rule-circular. I'm doubtful, primarily because I don't yet see that these arguments are any more fundamental than any other ampliative inferences.

Secondly, and more importantly: However the question above is resolved, why not allow the explanation-friendliness of the world to serve as a vindication of the explanatory project? Certainly, the explanation-friendliness of the world seems to better "zero in" on the justificatorily-relevant features of explanatory indispensability arguments than does the practical rationality of explanatory practice for creatures like us. And Enoch's rule-circularity worry had better not rule out this proposed vindication, lest it rule out his as well. (I mean, if facts about essences and rationality are discoverable without the aid of ampliative inferences, then a lot of us are way overpaid.)

But if this is our vindication of explanatory indispensability arguments, note how easy it is to deny it to deliberative indispensability arguments. Explanatory indispensability can play an ontology-shaping role because the world is explanation-friendly; deliberative indispensability cannot, because the world is not deliberation-friendly.

Let me quickly comment on the book's remaining chapters and its overall style.

Chapter 4 extracts an argument for robust metaethical realism from Chapter 2's argument for metaethical objectivism of some sort, and Chapter 3's argument for realism about normativity of some sort.

Chapters 5 and 6 are the metaphysics chapters. In Chapter 5, Enoch argues against three attempts to "take morality seriously" without incurring robust realism's ontological commitments. These are naturalist realism, fictionalism, and quietism. Enoch's discussion of naturalism struck me as incomplete. He argues against a priori reductions of the normative to the natural on the grounds that normative thoughts "are so different from natural ones" (p. 104). This seems to me to ignore the possibility of an a priori synthetic reduction -- and specifically, a reduction partly by way of substantive moral theorizing, which is "substantive" precisely because of the differences Enoch emphasizes. I was persuaded by the arguments against fictionalism and quietism, though, and found his discussion of the latter especially helpful.

Chapter 6 is mostly a response to claims that the robust realist cannot explain the supervenience of the normative upon the natural. Enoch largely eschews metaphysics here, arguing instead that all of the requisite explanation can be done through conceptual analysis and normative theorizing. I found this to be one of the strongest parts of the book.

Chapters 7 and 8 are the epistemology chapters. Enoch argues that the fundamental epistemic challenge to realism is to explain the correlation between normative reality and the normative world as represented in our judgments. He exemplifies a way of responding to this challenge by responding to a more concrete challenge of Sharon Street's: given that our normative judgments were shaped in large part by natural selection, what explains the aforementioned correlation? (Street 2006) His answer to Street's challenge invokes the alleged banal truth that survival is good. But I kept wondering, first, what licenses such an anti-skeptical starting point in this domain specifically, and second, what sort of explanation we might give of how moral knowledge is possible. Enoch makes many valuable points over the course of these two chapters, but says little to satisfy these curiosities.

In Chapter 9, Enoch addresses the motivational objection to robust realism. Enoch does a valuable service in clarifying the motivational challenge, and responds to his interpretation of it using an account of acting for a reason that I, for one, found interesting in its own right.

Finally, Enoch writes in a confident, unpretentious style. And he is refreshingly forthcoming about what he regards as the shaky or incomplete aspects of his arguments. (I particularly liked this footnote: "Let's be honest: it's not that I've said so little because 'saying more would take me too far astray', or any such thing. I just don't know what more to say." (p. 71, n. 51.)) This sort of hedging can be tedious in large doses, but overall, I found it a welcome respite from the kind of propagandistic acolyte-bait that one sometimes sees in books this wide-ranging and ambitious. The inviting style of Taking Morality Seriously should help to win it a large audience that it has earned through its substance.

Works Cited

G.A. Cohen, "On the Currency of Egalitarian Justice," Ethics (1989).

P.M. Gollwitzer, "Action Phases and Mindsets," in E.T. Higgins and R.M. Sorrentino (eds.), Handbook of Motivation and Cognition, Vol. 2 (New York: Guilford Press, 1990).

Sharon Street, "A Darwinian Dilemma for Realist Theories of Value," Philosophical Studies (2006).

[1] Thanks to members of a student-faculty reading group at the University of Toronto for helpful discussions of Enoch's book.

[2] Benjamin Wald suggests that Enoch may reply that the dog does not count as a party to the conflict. A fair response. But if the dog does not count as a party, then I doubt the moral significance of party-hood as such. (We should say the same thing about the "Applebee's" case even if you are stipulated to be passed out in the back seat as I'm driving.)

[3] As Devlin Russell pointed out to me, even the simple subjectivist may have what, by his own lights, is a perfectly satisfactory explanation of why we ought to be conciliatory in non-moral conflicts but stubborn in moral ones: he wants to be conciliatory in the former and stubborn in the latter. Of course, you may think this is a lousy explanation, but this seems to rely on an antecedent rejection of simple subjectivism.