Talking to Our Selves: Reflection, Ignorance, and Agency

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John M. Doris, Talking to Our Selves: Reflection, Ignorance, and Agency, Oxford University Press, 2015, 264pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199570393.

Reviewed by David Shoemaker, Tulane University


It is a hoary stereotype that philosophers reflect all alone in torturous detail over the weight and role of each and every reason relevant to deep practical and theoretical matters. Whether or not this is an accurate portrait of many philosophers, it is at least true that many moral philosophers have advanced or assumed it as an ideal for human agents: Optimal human reasoning about what to do is a solitary matter, they say, and optimal human agency is a function of one's individual awareness of, reflection on, and endorsement of the best practical reasons. John M. Doris, in his charming and incisive new book, aims to erase (or at least scribble over) that picture, primarily by bringing to our attention a host of empirical work that suggests we often have no idea what we're doing or why we're doing it.

Part I is negative and Part II positive. The negative part involves an empirically-informed skepticism about reflectivism, the view that "the exercise of human agency consists in judgment and behavior ordered by self-conscious reflection about what to think and do" (19; emphasis in original). This could be an empirical claim about how human agents actually behave or a conceptual claim about how we must behave in order to be agents. Doris aims to cause trouble for both. He mounts a general skeptical argument against the empirical claim, drawing from loads of evidence showing we often seem to act in unreflective and downright self-ignorant ways. His positive argument in Part II involves revealing a moral psychology that embraces this self-ignorance as a crucial contributor to much human agency. In so doing, he rejects the purely individualistic view of both human reasoning and agency, advancing instead a collaborative and dialogic picture of who we are and how we act. If he's right, then the conceptual reading of reflectivism is also false.

While some contemporary agency theorists do allow that active, reflective awareness isn't necessary for agency and responsibility, there are at least two distinct theoretical strands that are quite vulnerable here if Doris is right: Kant and Kantians (e.g., Christine Korsgaard, R. Jay Wallace, Stephen Darwall, and J. David Velleman), and Harry Frankfurt and Frankfurtians. And for those not of either ilk, the spirit of reflectivism remains a familiar looming specter, a widely insinuated background belief, and one that Doris aims to exorcise.

So why doubt reflectivism? Doris appeals to numerous experimental results. Here's the splashiest: When images of eyes are put near a coffee service in a common area of an office, contributions to the "honor box" are three times as large as they are when images of flowers are there instead. Another example: If your name is Virginia, Georgia, Tex, or Cal, you are significantly more likely to move to, respectively, Virginia, Georgia, Texas, or California, and if your name begins with Geo (as in Geoffrey or George), you are significantly more likely to be a geoscientist. This is implicit egotism. There is also the now-familiar phenomenon of implicit bias, where subjects (of all races) tend toward discriminatory responses despite sincere avowals otherwise. Finally, there are cases of moral dumbfounding, where subjects insist it's wrong for the adult brother and sister to have sex, for example, even though it's been stipulated that no harm will result.

What's going on here? Doris starts with what is supposed to be an uncontroversial understanding of agency: A piece of behavior is an expression of agency -- self-governance -- to the extent that it is an expression of the agent's values (26). (This will actually be a very controversial formulation to some agency theorists, but set that aside.) The above examples, however, are instances of bypassing incongruity: the only plausible explanation is that the actions or attitudes in question were caused by unconscious forces that bypassed agents' reasoning and, were they aware of the actual causes, the agents would reject them as justifying reasons. After all, no one would say, if challenged, "I contributed coffee money today because of the eyespots."

These cases generate skepticism about reflectivism via a familiar sort of epistemological argument. Where the decisive causes of behavior would be rejected by the agent as justifiers, these causes are defeaters, and where there are defeaters, there is no agency. But given the evidence, we cannot rule out the existence of defeaters for any particular action, so we are not justified in attributing agency to actors in any particular case. Thus skepticism about agency.

There are two ways a reflectivist might try and deflect the skeptical argument. First, she might resist the legitimacy or lessons of each bit of empirical evidence. For instance, the original sibling incest finding has never been published and had a very small and homogeneous sample size (see), plus the experimenters heavily circumscribed which harms counted as relevant, and they discounted the possibility of both non-harm-based moral objections (cf. Jacobson 2012) and emotionally-grounded moral reasons against the practice. Doris himself admits that the implicit egotism effects are not universally thought to extend to naturalistic contexts (see, e.g., Simonsohn 2011). And there are several other studies showing that there are no name effects in domains where one might also expect it, e.g., batters whose names start with "K" don't strike out more often, and students whose names start with "A" don't get better grades (McCullough and McWilliams 2010, 2011).

Of course, Doris isn't relying on just a few studies; rather, he is presenting what I think of as a barrage argument. As he puts it, "No matter how it turns out for any individual study, I've plenty of evidence to choose from" (56). But he is also relying on a family of theories to support the existence of defeaters (e.g., bypassing incongruity is predicted by the widely accepted dual process theory of mind too). So perhaps the reflectivist will do better to focus on the skeptical argument itself.

It is a Cartesian-style argument. For Descartes, the possibility that I'm deceived by an evil genius in any individual instance entails that I could be wrong about everything I've ever believed. This is a general skepticism about knowledge of any kind. But Descartes only arrived at it after rejecting two other insufficient attempts to get there: the General Sensory Doubt and the Dream Doubt. The first goes by very quickly: Given that my senses sometimes deceive me, e.g., in optical illusions, perhaps they always deceive me. Descartes immediately realizes, though, that you can't get to general skepticism from that premise as there's an important difference between types of cases. When my senses deceive me, there's something about the conditions of observation at the time that gives me reason to be wary. For example, if I'm looking at something far off, or for the first time, or something that's clearly fooled me before, I can tell there and then that something might be funky, and I ought to withhold my assent to the verdict the senses seem to deliver. But there are many other situations where I easily recognize that I'm not in those conditions and so have no reason to worry. Only a madman would doubt, for example, that his body and immediate surroundings exist. Thus, to achieve general skepticism, Descartes has to move on to the Dream Doubt (and ultimately the Evil Genius Doubt) instead, as it does give us a reason to doubt all sensory knowledge precisely because there is nothing about the conditions of observation while dreaming that grounds suspicion.

So is Doris's argument against reflectivism just analogous to the General Sensory Doubt, falling short of being analogous to the more pervasive Dream or Evil Genius doubts he aims for? It seems there could be something about the conditions of observation in the defeater cases that could ground suspicion at the time, something indicating that one is in the type of circumstance where the incongruous bypassing effects tend to occur, namely, circumstances in which one tends to choose unreflectively. These are often just cases of habit. But one also tends to be unreflective generally when one has little at stake. Whether I leave a dollar in the honor box isn't an earth-shaking moral decision, nor is who I vote for as city comptroller. If I really don't much care what happens, I am indeed susceptible to influence by nonrational factors I would likely deny as justifiers. But when I do care, a reflectivist might say, I am moved to shake myself out of habit or automaticity to reflect more and focus exclusively on the factors that really matter. True, sometimes these are stressful cases in which emotional disturbances do bypassing work (76). But again, to the extent that I can make myself aware of that possibility while in the stressful situation ("I'm under stress, better watch out for defeaters!"), I have an accessible reason at the time to take greater care in deliberating. And on the flipside, there seem to be plenty of everyday (nonmoral) cases in which we know we're not in such circumstances, as when I decide to do what I want where it couldn't be more obvious what I want, as when I order a beignet with my coffee simply because I remember how tasty the combination always is (and maybe there's not even anything else on the menu to order!).

To the extent that we could either know we're in the space of lurking defeaters (and so have accessible reason to take deliberative care) or know that we're not, we could be immune to Doris's sweeping skeptical argument. Yes, there will be times when we're bypassed, but these will only implicate a small range of cases -- analogous to optical illusions -- in which we haven't paid sufficient attention to the conditions we're in. (Implicit bias cases might still seem to pose a difficulty, but they too are alterable by some reflective methods [Plant et al. 2005; Rudman et al. 2001], and there is recent evidence that the behavioral domains in which they have an influence are much smaller than previously thought [Oswald et al. 2013].)

Doris's response would be to note just how limited our self-awareness is, as he shows in Chapter 4, "Experience." And there is a rich body of evidence for widespread agential self-ignorance caused by motivated cognition, a function of our tendency toward self-enhancement and -- promotion. We are, essentially, confabulators (what he kindly calls instead "rationalizers"). Nevertheless, the reflectivist might still wonder if the circumstances of rationalization aren't going to be roughly coextensive only with the limited number of unreflectively defeated ("optical illusion") circumstances. There is, again, no opacity at all about what I want with my coffee when I've been mentally slavering over that beignet all morning.

Turn, though, to the interesting positive position developed in Part II. Doris's first step is to argue that optimal reasoning (including moral reasoning) is collaborative, and so is optimal agency, i.e., it is socially embedded. Social psychological evidence suggests that when we reason together, we typically reason better. But working out normative problems with someone -- as the case of psychotherapy demonstrates -- can also better facilitate the expression of one's actual values, seeding a breakthrough about the real sources of one's actions. This is an example of successful collaborative agency, of how external influences and inputs facilitate the expression of individual agential values.

The second step of the positive argument involves showing how the aforementioned self-ignorance facilitates agency in two ways. First, we sometimes better realize our values by thinking and acting as if we have control over things we have no control over, e.g., while I may be deluded about how much control I have over the success of my marriage (which may be more a function of external factors like socioeconomic similarity), I may nevertheless be motivated by my belief in the illusion to work hard at it in a way that contributes to its success.

A second way in which self-ignorance facilitates agency goes to the collaborative point. In collaborative conversations, people generally want things to go well and so don't like contradicting one another (this presumably applies to people, not philosophers). When asked to explain normative judgments they had allegedly reported to an observer moments before, "judgments" that were different from the ones the subjects had actually reported, subjects went right ahead and offered justifications -- rationalizations, really -- for those "judgments," but they did it in such a fluid way that the process must have bypassed reflective self-awareness. Now imagine real-life normative conversations of this sort in what I'll call the "space of justification," the space in which we regularly operate with one another where we are susceptible to being asked why we did what we did. Silence in that space won't do; there is immense social pressure to come up with an answer to the demand, and what we tend to do in the absence of self-awareness of the actual causes of our behavior is offer up some reasons that at least make sense (this is what distinguishes us from clinical confabulators). In so doing, we are presenting ourselves to each other as agents: "I chose this, it was under my control."

The third step in the positive argument is to appeal to biography: we tell stories about ourselves to make sense of our lives. In telling our confabulations, we actually shape who we are and determine what our values become since there is cognitive pressure to avoid dissonance between our attitudes and our behavior. Indeed, requiring accurate self-knowledge may impede agency since we are epistemically fragile and if accuracy is required for agency, we are likely to founder when we get things wrong (145). So as the self-bullshitting creatures we actually are, we tend to plow through and do better at the expression of our values the less we know about ourselves. This process creates who we are. After I speak harshly to you, I may apologize while sputtering some lame excuse -- I'm under so much pressure at work, say -- that, while likely false, is just irrelevant to how we proceed from there. It's the giving of the apology that matters, and given that we value the resolution of our differences, my rationalization best facilitates this end. (Imagine telling the truth instead: "I'm sorry, but I was really sick of your yammering at the time.") Consequently, as Doris puts it, "By negotiating the contours of their biographies in interaction with others, people are able to shape their lives in ways that express their values" (153). Et voila: agency!

Doris finishes the book with chapters on responsibility and the self. In the former, he concedes that reflectivism may tell the right story for some attributions of responsibility but insists the just-told story (what he calls the "dialogic" conception of agency) is going to be the right one for most such attributions. In the last chapter, he tells a dialogic story about personal identity as well, wherein we achieve diachronic identity in a social fashion, as members of groups. There is some suggestive material in these chapters, but there won't be enough detail to address some questions that theorists specializing in responsibility and/or personal identity are likely to have. But Doris knows this as his remarks are really intended to spark, well, a conversation.

Before we can have that conversation, though, we do need some clarity about crucial aspects of the view, especially about the nature of the expressed values agency consists in. To see why, let us return our gaze to the Watching Eyes effect, something Doris does not do. What would his positive theory of agency say about it? Suppose I put the money in the honor box when the eyespots are there this week, but I didn't do so last week when the eyespots weren't there. When you notice and ask me about it, I'm surely going to offer up some (false) rationalization: "It looked like we were needing the money a bit more this week," or "I felt like I hadn't been giving my fair share in the past." Am I morally responsible for what I did? On Doris's account, it depends on whether I expressed my values in each case.

Now I'm clearly going to be ignorant of the real cause of my actions, but that won't undercut the possibility that I'm still expressing my values, for Doris allows (as he'd better) that my values may be expressed in the face of my false rationalizations (as occurs with Huck Finn, on one reading [160]). But now it sounds as if the purported defeaters on a reflectivist construal of agency are not necessarily defeaters for Doris's dialogic construal of agency. Doubt may now start to creep in: What would count as a defeater on his construal?

We could only get an answer from a clearer account of what values are, how they are identified, and, most importantly, what constitutes the difference between their being expressed in action and their merely according with actions. Doris does spend some time on these issues (160-164), but perhaps not enough. His answer is basically that we simply have to infer from agents' behavioral patterns what their values are and when they're being expressed. Third-person inferences have to take epistemic priority here since self-ignorance is so rife. But then if I were regularly to put money in the honor box when the eyes were there but didn't when they weren't, mightn't you have to say that I actually value looking good in the "eyes" of others or that I simply fear getting caught not contributing my fair share? And this question has a more expansive version: If we tend to rationalize like this generally in the space of justification, wouldn't these considerations about looking good and fearing getting caught also count as our expressed values there (and so in most every social space)? In other words, to the extent that there will almost always be some values-related pattern or other that is plausibly attributable to us, Doris's view may allow for too much agency.

To get a more plausible -- less capacious -- construal of agency, we would have to hear more about how actions express (versus merely accord with) values as well as see a clearer construal of what counts as a value in the first place. Here is where Doris's positive proposal could engage well with and be buttressed by the work of some contemporary "attributability" theorists who have been addressing these issues (e.g, Nomy Arpaly and Timothy Schroeder, Angela Smith, and Chandra Sripada, among others).

Two final comments about method and style. First, Doris has done a huge service to the cause of empirical philosophy with this book. It is a model of how to do psychologically-informed work since he discusses method at every crucial stage. He's acutely aware of the recent replication problems in social psychology, as well as various contributing biases, and he offers guidance for how to think about the evidence he provides in light of them. He presents prima facie counterevidence to his claims, and he discusses it fairly. This is empirical philosophy with integrity.

Second, Doris has a very distinctive writing style. Some will hate it, thinking it way too informal or cute for their necessary and sufficient tastes. I, however, loved it. It is lively and accessible, replete with self-effacing anecdotes and hilarious asides. It feels as if one is chatting with an amiable and knowledgeable companion at the bar. Indeed, it has a surprisingly collaborative feel to it, not just because one finds oneself talking (or animatedly yelling) back at Doris as one reads it but also because it is sufficiently generous of spirit that one can easily envision the conversation continuing right off the page.

This is a valuable book. It reminds us, with striking real-life evidence, just how hidden we often are from ourselves. Whether this evidence is compatible with our being morally responsible agents is the next important conversation agency theorists ought to have, and we should be grateful to Doris for sparking it in such a bold, original, and colorful way.


The author is grateful to the members of a reading group at Tulane University for discussion of some of the issues in this review.


Jacobson, Daniel. 2012. "Moral Dumbfounding and Moral Stupefaction." Oxford Studies in Normative Ethics 2: 289-315.

McCullough, B. D., and Thomas P. McWilliams. 2010. "Baseball players with the initial "K" do not strike out more often." Journal of Applied Statistics 37: 881-891.

McCullough, B. D., and Thomas P. McWilliams. 2011. "Students with the initial 'A' don't get better grades." Journal of Research in Personality 45: 340-343.

Oswald, Frederick L.; Mitchell, Gregory; Blanton, Hart; Jaccard, James; and Tetlock, Philip E. 2013. "Predicting ethnic and racial discrimination: A meta-analysis of IAT criterion studies." Journal of Personality and Social Psychology 105: 171-192.

Plant, E. Ashby; Peruche, B. Michelle; and Butz, David A. 2005. "Eliminating automatic racial bias: Making race non-diagnostic for responses to criminal suspects." Journal of Experimental Social Psychology 41: 141-156.

Rudman, Laurie A.; Ashmore, Richard D.; and Gary, Melvin L. 2001. "'Unlearning' automatic biases: the malleability of implicit prejudice and stereotypes." Journal of Personality and Social Psychology 81: 856-868.

Simonsohn, U. 2011. "Spurious? Name Similarity Effects (Implicit Egotism) in Marriage, Job, and Moving Decisions." Journal of Personality and Social Psychology 101: 1-24.