Teleology, First Principles, and Scientific Method in Aristotle's Biology

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Allan Gotthelf, Teleology, First Principles, and Scientific Method in Aristotle's Biology, Oxford University Press, 2012, 464pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199287956.

Reviewed by Devin Henry, Western University


Over the past several decades Allan Gotthelf has established himself as one of the leading experts on Aristotle's philosophy of biology. This book is a collection of his most important papers on the subject. Readers already familiar with Gotthelf's work will not find many surprises in it. Gotthelf, however, does an excellent job of revising the papers and identifying connections between them so that they form a more unified body of work. And for those who are new to Aristotle's biology this book is an exceptional resource. It contains a wealth of interesting and provocative ideas on everything from the nature of teleological causation, to the relation between Aristotle's scientific theory and practice, to an analysis of the concepts of form, essence and substance, to a discussion of Darwin's views on Aristotle as a biologist.

In Part I Gotthelf develops and defends his unique interpretation of Aristotle's natural teleology. He argues that, for Aristotle, the use of teleological explanations is sanctioned by the absence of a full account in terms of material necessities alone, "since that absence alone entails that the form of the living organism has a real causal role (as aim) in the organism's generation" (71). On Gotthelf's reading, teleological explanations of the generation of living things and their parts must include, in addition, reference to "an irreducible potential for form", which imposes a "primitive directedness" on the process. He then goes on to argue (in Chapter 2) against a normative conception of ends: while it is true that, for Aristotle, an end (telos) is always something good, that goodness is not part of what it is to be an end; instead the concept of an end is to be understood in terms of the concept of actuality. On this reading Aristotle thinks we identify which stage of a process constitutes its end by identifying which potential(s) is being actualized.

The remainder of the book emphasizes the systematic organization and explanatory structure of Aristotle's biological works and argues that Aristotle self-consciously attempted to set up biology as a demonstrative science carefully modeled on the theory of the Analytics. For example, in Chapter 7 Gotthelf shows how the explanations in Parts of Animals II-IV contain an implicit axiomatic structure (or at least the outlines of one): those explanations take the form of demonstrations (apodeixeis) aimed at generating scientific knowledge (epistêmê) of animals, which ultimately rest on a set of first principles (archai) expressing certain facts about animal kinds that are not themselves explained by reference to more basic facts. He illustrates this axiomatic structure in Chapter 8 by examining Aristotle's account of the elephant's trunk (PA II 16). What this example shows, Gotthelf argues, is that Aristotle thinks (i) multiple features of an animal kind can serve as first principles of demonstration (the explanation of the elephant's trunk is explained by reference to at least five different basic facts about its nature) and (ii) these features can include basic facts about an animal's material nature. This challenges the standard reading of Aristotle on two fronts. First, scholars have traditionally understood Aristotle as holding that the essence of a kind K must be a single feature that is the primary cause of all of K's other necessary features. Second, it is generally assumed that this single causally basic feature will be some aspect of a thing's form, which in the case of animals is its soul (see Charles 2000).

Chapter 10 offers a preliminary study of the conceptions of essence and substance at work in Aristotle's biology. Orthodox readers of the Metaphysics will find the results of Gotthelf's study jarring. For he shows (conclusively in my view) that Aristotle is willing to include in the essence of an animal not only capacities of its soul (form) but also its parts, physical dimensions, and even features of its bodily constitution (matter). More importantly, Gotthelf argues that there are no privileged objects of definition in the biology but that definitions apply at varying levels, from the lowest species (e.g., human, horse), to the widest kinds (e.g., birds, fish), and even to the parts themselves (e.g., claws). This leaves unclear what exactly the primary substances of Aristotle's biology are.

One virtue of this collection is the sheer breadth of issues it covers. When it comes to Aristotle's philosophy of biology Gotthelf definitely leaves few stones unturned. The reader may not agree with his interpretation at every turn, but she will be hard pressed to find questions about Aristotle's biology that he has not considered and (in many cases) offered compelling answers to. What I find particular attractive about the book is Gotthelf's approach to Aristotle's biology. It is much more philosophically driven than a lot of scholarship on the subject. It is very easy, when reading Aristotle's biology, to get bogged down in the blood-and-guts descriptions of how living things work. References to heatings andcoolings, sinew, blood vessels, and soft and hard fat abound. Gotthelf does an exceptional job of showing the reader how these gritty details relate to core philosophical issues such as reductionism, definition and essence, and natural kinds. This is a laudable achievement since the philosophical significance of Aristotle's biological writings is not always transparent. While the discussion is at times somewhat parochial (especially Part IV), there is much in this collection for the average Aristotle specialist to sink her teeth into. Two things are likely to strike her as particularly engaging: Gotthelf's interpretation of Aristotle's teleology and his views about the close relation between the biological works and the theory in the Analytics. In the remainder of this review I shall raise some questions about the former.

Gotthelf's interpretation of Aristotle's natural teleology raises two main worries. First, as Gotthelf recognizes, his interpretation depends on treating the presence of a potential (dunamis) for form as explanatorily basic: "For, otherwise, whatever explains the presence of such a potential will be more basic, and will be in fact what grounds teleological explanation." (32) But this seems to conflict with Aristotle's insistence in Metaphysic IX 8 that actuality is ontologically prior to potentiality, since "the actuality is the end, and it is for this that the potential is acquired (telos d' hê energeiakai toutou charin hê dunamis); for animals do not see in order that they may have sight but have sight in order that they may see" (1050a4-14). I take the upshot of this passage to be the following. Even if we accept Gotthelf's view that the development of living things and their parts depends on the presence of a dunamis that is (in some sense) "irreducibly for" those ends, it is a mistake to treat the presence of such a dunamis as "basic from the point of view of explanation". For Aristotle insists here that potentials are present because (i.e., for the sake) of the states and activities they produce (cf. GA II 6, 742a20-36). Why do raptors have talons? The embryologist will point to the activation of a dunamis (a developmental capacity), which is the intrinsic efficient cause of a process that results in talons being formed at the end of its toes. Why do raptors as a species possess that dunamis? Gotthelf suggests there is no further explanation for this fact; the presence of that dunamis is explanatorily basic and is what ultimately grounds a teleological explanation of those parts. However, the Metaphysics IX 8 passage seems to clearly indicate that we can explain the presence of that dunamis by referring to the function of talons and (we may add) the contribution that that function makes to the raptor's way of life. In this way the goodness of the end generated by the dunamis is what ultimately explains (as a final cause) the presence of that dunamis in those animals that have it.

Now Gotthelf rejects this kind of interpretation, which takes goodness to be an essential feature of Aristotle's conception of ends (Chapter 2). On his reading, while it may be true that Aristotle thinks ends are always something good, "they will not be ends in virtue of being goods" (47). This highlights a second worry with his interpretation. For that seems to be exactly the view that Aristotle rejects in Metaphysics A 7. That passage has traditionally been understood as claiming that final causation requires invoking the good as a per se cause. This is why Aristotle thinks no one before him grasped the final cause. For they may have employed the good in their accounts but only as an incidental cause:

In a way they [sc. Aristotle's predecessors] say that that for the sake of which actions, changes, and motions take place is a cause, but they do not speak of it in the way that it is naturally (pephuken) a cause. For those who speak of Mind or Friendship as good set these down as causes, but not as that for the sake of which things exist or come to be but only as that from which the change originates. . . . So that in a sense they both say and do not say that the good is a cause; for they do not call the good a cause in the unqualified sense (haplôs) but only incidentally (kata sumbebêkos). (Metaphysics A 7, 988b16-15)

Consider Empedocles (cf. 985a5-10). Empedocles says that Love (or Friendship) is the cause of all things. And since Love is good, in a sense, he makes what is good a cause of all things. But this makes the good an incidental cause insofar as Love happens to be something good. Love is not a cause in virtue of being good. In the same way, when Gotthelf asserts that "the very same states (or activities) which are ends will also be goods, but they will not be ends in virtue of being goods" (47) he turns the good into an incidental cause.For he does not treat the good as a cause haplôs but only kata sumbebêkos.[1] Putting these two issues together, the main worry with Gotthelf's interpretation is that by taking the presence of a potential for form as basic in a teleological explanation and stripping final causation of its normative component it seems to lose what is surely the essence of Aristotelian teleology, namely, the idea that something F ultimately exists or comes to be because it is good.[2]

These are relatively small worries, however, for there is much to be praised in this excellent collection. While it will likely be of interest mostly to Aristotle specialists, it tackles issues of a much broader historical significance in an engaging and delightful way.


M. Bedau, "Where's the Good in Teleology?", Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 52(4), 1992, 781-806

J. Cooper. 1987. "Hypothetical Necessity and Natural Teleology." In Philosophical Issues in Aristotle's Biology, edited by Allan Gotthelf and James G. Lennox, 243-74. Cambridge: CUP.

D. Charles. 2000. Aristotle on Meaning and Essence. Oxford: OUP.

S. Suavé Meyer. 1992. "Aristotle, Teleology, and Reduction." The Philosophical Review. 101(4), 791-825.

[1] Gotthelf acknowledges that the passage in Metaphysics A 7 has been taken as evidence that Aristotle thinks "reference to the good is fundamental to our understanding of the end or final cause" (46). But he never addresses this passage or offers an alternative reading that is compatible with his own interpretation. And yet this is surely a pivotal text in the debate; it strikes me as clinching the case for the normative reading.

[2] See Physics II 2, 194a28-33; II 3, 195a23-5; IA II, 704b12-18; and Cooper (1987, n. 4). For an instructive, though ultimately unsatisfying, discussion of this point in contemporary philosophy see Bedau (1992). My reading of Aristotle on this point is closer to Suavé Meyer (1992, 811-12), though I have serious doubts about the way she cashes out the idea that offspring have the species-typical parts they do "because they are good". Her historical account makes it sound as though Aristotle discovered the mechanism of natural selection.