Tetralogue: I'm Right, You're Wrong

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Timothy Williamson, Tetralogue: I'm Right, You're Wrong, Oxford University Press, 2015, 153pp., $18.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780198728887.

Reviewed by Earl Conee, University of Rochester


Tetralogue is a philosophical conversation among four train passengers. Their discussions address rational disagreement, truth, assertion, fallibility, relativism, and the nature of moral evaluations. The participants are Bob, who is a believer in witchcraft, Sarah, who is a science enthusiast and a tentative moral relativist, Zac, who is an ardent relativist about all evaluations, and Roxana, who is an advocate of rigorous thought. The conversations are informal but philosophically focused. The tone ranges from playful to harsh, with Roxana contributing the harshness. She is amusingly rude.

Two issues will be discussed here. The dialogue is valuably provocative about them. Their treatment is clearly not intended to be the last word. But it will be suggested that taking each in a somewhat different direction might have been advantageous.

A dispute between Bob and Sarah opens Part 1. Bob attributes his recent injury to witchcraft. Sarah denies that witchcraft works. They allege that they have ample evidential support without giving details. An impasse develops. Zac advocates a relativistic view of their claims. He suggests that each is 'quite right from [his or her] own point of view' (9) and nothing is 'absolutely right' or 'absolutely wrong.' (31) A person's 'point of view' is what the person sincerely believes. (17) Sarah makes two attempts to formulate the thesis of Zac's relativism. They run into trouble. Zac eventually says that relativism is not so much a theory as it is an 'attitude to life.' (33)

The attempted formulations of Zac's relativism go astray. Here is the first one:

ZR1. Every point of view is just a point of view. (32)

ZR1 compresses its relativism into 'just'. Sarah finds trouble there. In effect we are asked to consider this exchange.

Bob says:

S1. Witchcraft works.

Sarah replies:

S2. That is just your point of view.

The 'just' in S2 appears to have Sarah denying that S1 is true. This suggests to Sarah that ZR1, with its 'just,' does not simply interpret S1. Instead, ZR1 implies a rejection of what Bob says in claims like S1. (33) Sarah further contends that, when Zac comments on some previous statement of his that it is 'just my point of view', the similarity of that comment to Sarah's reply to Bob argues that Zac is retracting his previous statement. Zac intends his relativism not to imply any such rejection or retraction. Sarah suggests deleting that word 'just' from ZR1:

ZR2. Every point of view is a point of view. (33)

Zac accepts ZR2. But there is no relativism in ZR2. Sarah notes that it is a triviality. At this point Zac responds that his relativism is mainly an attitude to life. (33)

Zac's relativism might have been more faithfully formulated. Again, concerning Bob and Sarah's dispute over the efficacy of witchcraft, Zac says that each is 'quite right' from his or her own point of view, where a 'point of view' is a body of beliefs. Zac denies the existence of 'absolute' truth and falsehood. The suggested version of relativism is a thesis about truth being relative to beliefs and a thesis about proper assertion being determined by the asserter's beliefs:

ZR3. Nothing is true or false, though a statement can be true or false in relation to "a point of view," that is, a body of beliefs; an assertion of A by S is proper when "A is true from S's point of view," that is, S believes A.

Zac abides by ZR3 throughout. For instance, having declared his relativism, Zac responds to a challenge about his knowing what his own point of view is by asserting that it is his point of view that relativism is true from his point of view. Sarah responds by accusing Zac of 'changing the subject' from relativism to a claim about Zac's point of view and 'retreating' from an assertion of relativism. (28-29) But Zac is not changing the subject or retreating from ZR3 when he says that relativism is true from his point of view and that that claim itself is true from his point of view. When Zac cites his point of view on some assertion that he has made, he is observing that the assertion has the relative truth that makes the assertion proper according to ZR3. When Zac says concerning one of his statements that it is 'just' his point of view, he is not rejecting or retracting it. Instead he is either noting that the statement's truth relative to his beliefs allows its falsehood relative others' beliefs or he is denying that it has the absolute truth. All of this is in accordance with ZR3.

A different objection to Zac's relativism seems better. Roxana in effect sets up the objection when she affirms the Aristotelian view that to say how things are is to say something true. (44-47) This truth is absolute and unrelativized. Roxana could have observed that believing a proposition includes a commitment to the proposition's saying how things are. She could have inferred from her Aristotelian view that believing includes a commitment to truth. Zac's relativism makes primitive use of belief in explaining its relative truth. So the relativism relies on there being a coherent notion of absolute truth. Roxana could have concluded that this leaves no good basis for the ZR3 denial that there are absolute truths.

Part 4 opens with the group witnessing a mother slapping her child. Sarah morally condemns this act. She attempts to defend this condemnation while upholding a version of moral relativism. After some worthwhile exchanges about the tenability of the moral relativism, the discussion turns to the place of moral evaluations in practical reasoning. Sarah argues that the practical role of moral evaluations supports their having some reliability. Here is Sarah's summary of her reasoning:

We aren't completely incompetent at deciding what is to be done, which depends on our moral beliefs, so it's very improbable that they are hopelessly false. (148)

The initial premise concerning our competence at deciding what is to be done should be clarified. The dialogue offers some interpretive indications. Roxana affirms, to no dissent, that a particular decision not to prune the roses 'was true if and only if pruning the roses was not to be done.' (144) So 'A is to be done' has a truth-value. It states an evaluation of A. What evaluation? A few subsequent remarks are suggestive. Sarah says that moral values are not 'dysfunctional' and that many day-to-day decisions are 'more or less right.' (145) Sarah also asserts that rats are 'pretty good at making practical decisions' and that 'we can't be too bad at decision-making.' (146) Both are asserted on the grounds that a species would not have survived if its members 'usually messed up their decisions about what to do.' (146)

The suggestion of these remarks is that the evaluation that 'A is to be done' makes, when said about some human act A, is that A furthers human survival. Whether or not this is the intended reading, taking the first premise in Sarah's reasoning this way is good for its defense. Clearly our decisions have not been 'completely incompetent' at perpetuating the human species. If instead 'A is to be done' is intended as an evaluation of A's having some other sort of goodness or correctness, then the premise asserting that we have at least a modicum of competence at this needs defense. Tetralogue does not provide one.

Sarah's other premise asserts that our decisions about what is to be done 'depend on our moral beliefs.' That is less clearly correct. Many decisions have a moral component. But many decisions seem not to involve morality, such as those derived from craving, fear, self-advantage, and tradition. The proportions matter. Unless a high proportion of the decisions are morally influenced, the asserted slight competence of our decisions in promoting human survival will not imply that it is highly probable that the moral beliefs have any positive correlation with truth. A slight competence at something does not imply that any factor that is frequently absent has much probability of helping with that competence.

In any event, the argument's form is equally available in defense of parallel conclusions about some beliefs that are seldom true. Suppose that 'supernatural' or 'prejudicial' is substituted for 'moral' in the reasoning. Human decisions might have been about as commonly influenced by superstition and prejudice as by morality. If so, then the substitutions result in equally good arguments for conclusions asserting that supernatural and prejudicial beliefs have a low probability of being 'hopelessly false.' Yet clearly such beliefs really are that bad.

Tetralogue might have defended differently our access to moral truth by taking farther a case that Roxana makes for our competence at moral classifications. Sarah's inclination toward moral relativism derives from a fairly specific skepticism concerning moral truth. Sarah thinks that there are some crucial differences between moral values and scientific magnitudes. The differences concern measurement and observation. In response Roxana argues persuasively that the moral values Sarah favors, health and happiness, are measurable with the aid of further theory about them, just as plainly scientific quantities are measurable with the aid of further theory. Roxana also argues persuasively against Sarah's worry that moral values are too abstract from sensory qualities for us to observe them. The values are no more abstract from sensory qualities than are some conditions that we are plainly good at identifying, like being in checkmate. Additionally, Roxana points out that we are plainly good at identifying instances of the abstract classification so-called misdeeds, that is, instances that seem to us to be moral wrongdoings. (137-140)

Roxana might have kept going along those lines. She might have questioned whether we have any special skeptical reason to deny that our carefully classified cases of misdeeds are usually genuine misdeeds. What could argue for a special incompetence at moral classifications? They are often emotionally charged. But so are some classifications about which our careful judgments are reliable, such as birth and death, danger and delight. Moral classifications have differed drastically over time and across cultures. But so have judgments about topics on which current experts have a recognizable reliability, such as medical and astronomical classifications. Moral disagreements often stay stubbornly unresolved. But so do disagreements concerning topics where the typical careful classifications are straightforwardly reliable, such as authorship and legality. Such comparisons might have challenged the reader to find any pivotal difference between our careful moral judgments and careful judgments on some other topics where it is clear that no special skepticism is warranted.

Tetralogue has an abundance of merits. It is lively and frequently incisive. It pursues several important philosophical issues efficiently and without remaining on well-trodden ground. It does not require any academic background. It could contribute usefully to undergraduate courses that address any of its topics.