The Act of Thinking

Placeholder book cover

Derek Melser, The Act of Thinking, MIT Press, 2004, 304pp, $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 0262134462.

Reviewed by Robert A. Wilson, University of Alberta


This is a book that challenges the current orthodoxy, both in the philosophy of mind and in the cognitive sciences, that thinking (construed broadly to include perceiving, imagining, remembering, etc.) is a mental process in the head. Such a view has been largely taken for granted since the demise of behaviorism in the 1960s, and it underpins both the representational and computational theories of mind, including their connectionist and dynamicist variants. While the orthodoxy has been rejected in recent years by a motley collection of e-theorists -- externalists, embodiers, embedders, and extended minders -- Melser's view is quite distinct from such views. For Melser, rather than thinking being a process that begins in the head but extends beyond it (as most e-theorists hold), it is a personal-level activity, something that a person does through her actions. Since Melser views such activities as disjoint from natural processes, thinking is not a natural process at all, the sort of thing that we might study scientifically. Thus, thinking is a personal action that calls for a different kind of study, one that draws on empathy, interpretation, and hermeneutics.

That is the view defended at the core of the book (chs.1-7), and if it makes it sound like a very old-fashioned book, that's because it is. Melser's antecedents are philosophers such as Gilbert Ryle, J.L. Austin, and Stuart Hampshire, both in style and in content. Apart from Melser's heavy reliance on selective parts of developmental psychology, there is minimal discussion of substantive work in contemporary cognitive science. That is what might be expected from an author whose view is that whatever it is cognitive scientists are doing, it is not (much to their surprise, no doubt) the investigation of thinking. As I will try to show in a moment, however, the central argument of the book could have been strengthened by more direct engagement with such empirical work.

There is more to the book than this, and in many ways I find its remainder (chs. 8-10) the more thought-provoking part of it. It is here that Melser turns from the positive case for his own activity-based view of thought to his negative case against the idea that thinking takes place in the head. Melser argues that contemporary philosophers and cognitive scientists have been held captive by the "in the head" metaphor, as if they were still sitting in Ryle's Cartesian Theatre (with the lights out, of course). Metaphors are pervasive in how the mind and thought are described, and Melser does an admirable job of documenting just how long the reach of metaphor is here. The basic idea in this part of the book is that since it is metaphors "all the way down" for the internalist about the mind, there is no naturalistic grounding for internalist talk about the mind, and so no basis for thinking that there is some internal agent for thought -- the mind or the brain. Without an internal agent for thought, viewing thought as in internal process loses credibility.

Let's put some meat on the bones of the above overview. Following several chapters that review earlier action-based theories of thinking (including the abbreviationism of Margaret Washburn and the refraining theory offered by Ryle), Melser introduces the two notions central to his own view: that of concerted activity and that of tokening a performance. To say that an activity is concerted is to say that it is done by two or more people together or in unison (p.56). To token an activity or performance is to begin it but stop short of completing it (p.76), such as when one begins to raise one's arm above one's head but then ends the action by simply scratching one's cheek. Since both of these notions concern activity, one might wonder how their introduction secures a thesis about thought or thinking. At the heart of Melser's view is the principle that to understand what thinking is one needs to understand how it is that thinking originates (pp.55, 94); he then argues, by an appeal to developmental evidence, that thinking originates as the tokening of concerted activity. The first identifiable cognitive activities of infants -- bodily imitating the actions of others, responding to speech, joint attention -- all develop as concerted activities. These concertings are learned, as is their tokening, which eventuates in solo action (chapter 5). The same is true for perception (chapter 6) and thinking narrowly construed (chapter 7).

One dialectical weakness to this argument is that it gives rise to Russellian thoughts of theft over honest toil. In particular, it seems (and will seem to many developmental psychologists, should they read the book) to secure its conclusions about thought only by defining thinking as a person-level activity in the first place. Melser himself is sensitive to this kind of issue in spelling out what he thinks is required for infants to perform the crucial early developmental activity of imitation, for here (p.59) he lists four abilities -- perceptual, motoric, coordinative, and success recognitional -- and says that since these would normally be viewed as aspects of thinking (in the broad sense), his view presupposes the very kinds of thing that activity is meant to cause. Yet Melser's response to this point is to declare that, despite appearances, none of these requisite abilities is really cognitive, being instead something more like physiological reflexes (p.60). This, however, only heightens the sense of victory by semantic fiat.

To see that there is a substantive argument to be made in place of definitional sleight of hand, consider some of the work in developmental psychology that Melser ignores. Much of post-Piagetian developmental cognitive psychology -- let's date it from the appearance of Susan Carey's Conceptual Change in Childhood (1985) -- has argued that children possess rich, innate conceptual structures, including domain-specific theories for physical objects, biology, psychology, number, and social kinds. Some of the striking findings here (about number and physical objects, for example) have concerned infants in their very first months. Presumably, Melser must view the abilities that underlie task performance here as "physiological", rather than "cognitive" in nature, but it's clear that, dialectically, one can't simply appeal to their innate nature as a basis for this decision. In short, many developmental psychologists, following Chomsky's views of language, think that there are genuine cognitive structures that are innate, and if they are right then Melser's developmental defense of the activity view of thinking as concerted tokening of action cannot be. For this reason alone, the omission of any substantive discussion of this work represents a major lacuna in Melser's argument.

There is another way to come at this point. Suppose that we acknowledge the central role of concerted activity in generating actions that are recognizably thoughtful or cognitive. Surely there is a substantive scientific question as to how it is that we are able to do this, and that the answer to this question just as surely has something to with the sorts of internal cognitive structures that are either innate or are acquired independently of the concerted activity that they make possible. This is just the kind of point that Chomskyans made four decades ago about behaviorist accounts of language acquisition. Again, Melser's argument would likely have benefited by directly addressing it.

I suspect that part of what Melser should have done here would have been to treat his catch-all category of thinking more imaginatively than he does. While he shares with recent authors the reconceptualization of perception as a form of action, for example, his theory is simply applied successively in chapters 5-7 to actions, perceiving, and thinking (narrowly construed), where these standard categories for mental activities don't really depart from their classical conception as (respectively) the output, input, and "throughput" parts of cognition. As the recent work of Susan Hurley and Alva No‘ makes clear, however, such a conception requires some re-thinking.

I began by pointing out that Melser shares with what I called "e-theorists" of the mind a critical view of internalist models of and assumptions about the mind. It should now be clear just how much more ambitious (and problematic) is Melser's project. For unlike most e-theorists (and here I would include Andy Clark, Mark Rowlands, Dan Dennett, and myself), who accept that much cognition is intracranial but argue that not all of it (and much of what is most important about it) is, Melser takes much higher ground. As a result, he must reject a great chunk of contemporary work in the cognitive sciences wholemeal. This has resulted in Melser saying disappointingly little about work on cognition over the past 30 years, something that I have suggested weakens his argument considerably. One wonders what Melser would say about standard results about cognition, such as priming effects for memory recall, gestalt chunking in the perceptual field, or the rapidity of lexical acquisition, since they are typically accounted for by positing specific internal structures, such as short-term memory and the lexicon. By passing over such work, Melser's book will be viewed by many in both the philosophy of mind and the cognitive sciences not as the ambitious, redirectional project that it promises to be, but as a more reactionary, empirically innocent account of how to think about thinking.

Consider, finally, the "other part" of the book, the one that appeals to the metaphorical nature of our talk of minds as a way of undermining internalist views of thought and cognition. In keeping with his assumption that origins reveal essences, here Melser begins by asking where our folk conception of the mind comes from. Melser argues that it neither derives from observation of oneself or others, nor from an (innate) folk theory of mind, but from learning to use the stock of metaphors that describe the mind in ordinary language. Broadly speaking, this is a social constructivist view of our conception of mind, much as we might offer such a view of our conceptions of families, religious figures of worship, or polite behavior.

Suppose that Melser is right here. What follows? His own conclusion is akin to a Rylean eliminativism that says that "the mind" as conceived by the folk simply does not exist. Yet we might resist this in at least two distinct ways. The first would be the reject the central assumption in both parts of the book -- that origins reveal essences -- perhaps by drawing on the standard, positivist distinction between "contexts of acquisition" and "contexts of justification", or perhaps in some other way. I would side with Melser on this issue, however, even if I would like a more nuanced statement (and defense) of the origins-reveal-` essences principle. But we might take a second path to resist Melser's eliminativism about the folk conception of mind. Perhaps there is no internal agent of thinking, as Melser argues, yet this is not because persons are the agents of thinking but because thinking is a natural process that needs to be understood decompositionally, as do other biological processes. Melser begins his book by making a prima facie case that thinking is not a natural process, primarily by identifying five features that thinking has but that natural processes lack (it is self-aware, publicly unobservable, voluntary, morally evaluable, and learnt). He concludes the book by returning to this issue through a discussion of the view he calls action physicalism, the view that people's actions are physical events that can thus be analyzed physiologically (or, more generally, functionally, I suppose), arguing that it is undermined by two dichotomies: that between empathy and observation, and that between metaphor and description. I found both discussions problematic: the first because these features apply only to a subset of what I would count as thinking (and that Melser must also count as thinking if he is to defend his claims in full generality); and the second because both dichotomies to which Melser appeals seem to me significantly more problematic than the position they are invoked to question.