The Actual and the Possible: Modality and Metaphysics in Modern Philosophy

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Mark Sinclair (ed.), The Actual and the Possible: Modality and Metaphysics in Modern Philosophy, Oxford University Press, 2017, 239pp., $67.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198786436.

Reviewed by Kevin J. Harrelson, Ball State University


The reviewer of an anthology, like its editor, is in the difficult position of having to consider as a whole what others will examine only in its parts. In this instance the reviewer hopes to make a case for an exception: this book presents a range of views on modality in modern philosophy that are better appreciated as a collective. Readers who look to any of its nine chapters for topics of antecedent interest, to be sure, will be rewarded with solid, professional contributions. But those who read the whole thing will get an informed glimpse of a bigger picture.

Mark Sinclair outlines his editorial intentions in a concise introduction. For several decades a consensus, if a fairly loose one, had formed among analytic philosophers about modal propositions. Inspired by Kripke's semantics, proponents of possible worlds such as David Lewis treated modality as a fundamental aspect of reality. More recently, however, philosophers such as Kit Fine have begun to question whether modality 'goes all the way down'. The core of Fine's argument is that essence cannot be accounted for by de re necessity.

The genealogy of the earlier consensus, Sinclair relates, rests in the rejection of the medieval 'temporal' or 'statistical' conception of modality. According to the temporal view 'impossible' means 'never actual', 'possible' means 'sometimes actual', etc. The modern advance was to conceive of possibilities as independent of actualities. Historical work often has emphasized those philosophers, such as Leibniz, who implemented a stronger distinction between possibility and actuality.

Newer theories suggest, however, that contemporary philosophers might move to a model more similar to Aristotle, the philosopher of non-modal essences. Our historical moment thus begs, according to Sinclair, for a new look at some old theories of modality. Sinclair sets up his history smartly by beginning the volume with a study of Spinoza (Mogens Lærke, "Aspects of Spinoza's Theory of Essence"), and concluding it with an argument that Quine, a modal skeptic, foresaw the recent developments by Lewis and Fine (John Divers, "De Re Modality in the Late Twentieth Century: the Prescient Quine").

Lærke's contribution opens the volume with the claim that recent scholars have 'Platonized' Spinoza, attributing to him too strong a notion of possibility. The interpretive dilemma that Spinoza scholars face concerns his view of non-existents, as expressed in the notoriously difficult Ethics IIP8C. Lærke argues on various grounds that we should think of Spinoza's non-existents in a manner consistent with that philosopher's emphasis on the univocal nature of existence. For Spinoza there is only one domain of entities, and the stray references to 'formal essences' need rather to be explained away.

Although Lærke remains appropriately modest about the scope and purpose of such a scholarly study, readers (such as the reviewer) who are looking ahead to the bigger picture might wonder what is at stake in this first chapter. Why, in the first place, did scholars wish to 'Platonize' Spinoza? Is it not rather that they made him into a forerunner of Leibniz? While the latter had views on modality more akin to contemporary philosophers, Spinoza was so strict a determinist that it became puzzling for him that people could conceive of non-existent entities in the first place. Of course we can think of non-existent entities, and Spinoza did his best to accommodate the fact. The question to ask is: which Spinoza interests us? It seems to me that the more consistent, determinist Spinoza -- the one for whom modality is a problem hard to account for -- presents a more interesting theoretical option than does the tamer, more Leibnizian version. Lærke's heretical Spinoza even prepares the reader of this volume for the skeptical arguments to come.

After Stephan Leuenberger's reminder ("Wolff's Close Shave with Fatalism") that the metaphysics of modality has not always been a merely academic subject -- Wolff was exiled from Prussia for his views on contradiction -- the volume briefly offers a more canonical story: Ohad Nachtomy ("Modal Adventures between Leibniz and Kant: Existence and (Temporal, Logical, Real) Possibility") skillfully recites the narrative that runs from Leibniz through Kant to modern quantificational logic. Taking Kant's refutation of the ontological argument as his starting point, Nachtomy argues (66) that Leibniz's view of possibility as 'conceptual self-consistency' sets the stage for Kant's distinction between logical and real predicates. That distinction, it is well known, allowed Kant to conclude that "ascribing existence to x only points to x's modal status or position," which is the view that "Frege and Russell assimilated . . . into formal logic" (65). For Nachtomy, Leibniz's mistake was not to generalize his theory of possibility and apply it likewise to God.

Jessica Leech ("Kant's Material Condition of Real Possibility") provides a capable sequel to Nachtomy's story. Rather than portraying Kant as a forerunner of Frege and Russell, she examines his notion of real possibility. That status has a material condition that would admit possibility only to what "agrees with the formal conditions of experience" (113, Critique of Pure Reason A 218). With this condition, Leech argues, Kant presents an important middle path between the realist extreme of David Lewis and the skeptical extreme of Hume or Quine. Possibilities are real, but not everything is really possible.

Christopher Yeomans' "Hegel's Expressivist Modal Realism" presents another apt sequel to Leech's argument. Yeomans likewise emphasizes the notion of 'real possibility'. Hegel's account of possibility, we learn, is such that "the possibility of some fact is not its actuality somewhere else," but instead "the actuality of another fact" (118). This approach to modality has benefits over some more standard views. On one hand, Hegel distinguished possibility from actuality more strongly than even Leibniz, in that he did not try to conceive of possibility as a kind of actuality. On the other hand, he has implemented real relations of influence between possibles and actuals, a desideratum that the possible-world strategy, on most readings, sacrifices. Of considerable interest (but perhaps mainly to scholars of Hegel) is the way that Yeomans casts Hegel as a kind of realist where the temptation is otherwise to categorize him as an actualist.

The two essays that follow the Leibniz-Kant-Hegel triad present a variety of views that lie outside what is ordinarily the main trajectory. In "Russell on Modality," Thomas Baldwin traces his subject's development through a range of fascinating and well-motivated positions. The early Russell (circa 1897) presents a Kantian argument about the foundations of geometry being "necessarily true of any world in which experience is possible" (138). Russell then moves to an 'intuitionist' account of modality that he shared with Moore.

A few years later, around 1902, Russell developed a version of modal skepticism in a series of papers on Meinong. His bogeyman, in this period, is necessity, which he dispenses with in favor of the doctrine that all propositions are simply true or false. The meaning of 'possible', on the other hand, is merely epistemic. Still later, Russell began to argue that modal notions are properties of propositional functions rather than of propositions, and during this time he gave deflationary analyses of necessity. Baldwin speculates (154-5) on the relationship between this view of modality and the theory of descriptions.

These skeptical positions are balanced by the polyvalent accounts of modality traced by Peter Simons ("Modality and Degrees of Truth: An Austro-Polish Sideline in Twentieth-Century Modal Thought"), who looks at Meinong and Łukasiewicz. Simons argues for some interesting historical connections between these two thinkers, the upshot of which is straightforward: while Meinong's many arguments on modality required "a third truth status alongside true and false" (177), he did not work out the formal consequences of his arguments. Łukasiewicz, under the influence of Meinong, did so in several different ways. In 1917 he developed a three-valued system, which he later (1951, 1957) replaced with a four-valued logic.

Sinclair's own contribution ("Heidegger on 'Possibility'") examines a stark alternative. Heidegger diverges from traditional notions of actuality, with the result that he is able to assimilate possibility to human existence in a way that other philosophers have not done. Heidegger's target is Aristotle, whose distinction between actuality and possibility (according to Heidegger) had dominated later thinking about modality. Sinclair argues that his subject had some success in showing 'being-possible' to rest at the heart of human existence, with the result that actuality became, for Heidegger, a more derivative mode. In this episode possibility and actuality are cast in relation to humanity and death.

Divers' interesting essay on Quine closes the volume. He takes up an early argument by Quine to the effect that there are three possible responses to the latter's modal skepticism. Kripke, Lewis, and Fine, we learn, pursued the respective strategies in ways that Quine presciently devised. Divers does not overstate the conclusion, and he allows that much in this debate is left unsettled. Quine's three have had some success in pursuing their respective paths, but they have nonetheless argued in ways that would not force a committed Quinean to abandon the skeptical position. What Quine foresaw, we learn, was how far modal theorists would have to go to reject his position. David Lewis, of course, believed there to exist an "infinity of universes," whereas Fine has limited himself to a universe "that is more radically non-extensional" than even Aristotle's (234).

Is modal skepticism, as we find it in Quine, a position that we should consider today? Divers smartly, as the other authors in this volume do, leaves such questions to the reader. What he shows is that the historical record does not by itself always reveal clear winners and losers. The metaphysical interpretations of modal logic came rather at considerable cost, one that we are in a position to reassess.

What, then, should a history of modern modal theories look like? No doubt many philosophers will resist the idea that we need to look beyond Leibniz, Kant, C.I. Lewis, and Kripke. They have a plausible story to tell, but it is not the only story. The volume under review presents many arguments with which to challenge that view, and it does so in a very balanced and understated way. Should we take Russell and even Hegel seriously on modality? Did Łukasiewicz offer a real alternative for those who suspect that modal statements are not always true or false? Sinclair and his authors provide a nice guide for those who wish to consider such questions. But anyone interested in modern philosophy, metaphysics, or logic will be rewarded for reading it.