The Aesthetics and Ethics of Copying

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Darren Hudson Hick and Reinold Schmücker (eds.), The Aesthetics and Ethics of Copying, Bloomsbury, 2016, 432pp., $94.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781474254519.

Reviewed by Wesley D. Cray, Texas Christian University


The title of this volume might suggest that its contents converge upon a rather narrow set of issues: aesthetic and ethical issues pertaining to the act of copying. One might expect to find contributions building mostly on formative work by philosophers such as Nelson Goodman and Denis Dutton and, hence, anticipate discussions couched largely within the framework of contemporary analytic aesthetics. Working through the twenty essays and the introduction, however, the reader will quickly notice that, while these initial expectations may not be entirely inaccurate, they simply do not do justice to the impressive breadth of work being done here.

The volume, edited by Darren Hudson Hick and Reinold Schmücker, compiles original essays by not just philosophers, but also scholars working in fields such as art history, communication studies, legal studies, literary studies, media studies, and sociology -- as well as one professional DJ. The essays were developed in the context of The Ethics of Copying research group (2015-2016) and coordinated alongside a series of workshops by the Center for Interdisciplinary Research in Bielefeld, Germany. While most of the essays are philosophical, the authors do not limit themselves to engaging only with the tradition of analytic -- or even broadly Western -- philosophy. Among the noteworthy achievements of this volume, then, is its truly interdisciplinary nature. Engaging with a plethora of topics, the discussions here tend to avoid abstract meanderings and opt instead to touch ground and stay there, incorporating and taking seriously empirical data and the details of both legal and artworld practices. This volume, then, is largely one of genuinely applied philosophy, and would be of benefit both to those who are working outside of philosophy but seeking further conceptual clarity on these issues and to those who are working within philosophy but are interested in exploring further potential applications of their work.

Although the stated focus is on issues of aesthetics and ethics, a substantial portion of the essays address these issues by way of discussions of ontology, as well as discussions of legal theory and practice. And while everything is centered around the notion of copying, that notion is understood very broadly, so as to include issues pertaining to copyright, trademark, patent, plagiarism (including self-plagiarism), file-sharing, sampling, appropriation art, imitative behavior, the re-creation of "natural" environments, the artificial repopulation of once-extinct species, and even the perfect qualitative duplication of human persons. The volume closes with an entire chapter (or "coda") on disco edits. Accordingly, what we really have is a series of discussions on aesthetic, cultural, ethical, legal, and ontological issues as they pertain to a wide range of (sometimes only quite loosely) related topics that might be subsumed under some far-reaching notion of copying.

While there is much to be gotten out of these essays, they often operate quite independently of one another, lending a sense of disunity. Sometimes this is simply a matter of addressing non-overlapping aspects of the volume's startling broad topic. At other times, it is instead a matter of the essays engaging with one another only very little, despite there being some clear connections that cry out for further engagement amongst the contributors. There is often a preference for breadth over depth, with more questions raised than can be adequately answered, and answers often drawing on controversial assumptions that would require significant further argumentation to establish. To be clear: the editors' remarks in the introduction suggest a recognition of these (in my view) potential shortcomings, and I agree with them when they submit that these points come with the quite positive up-shot that these essays are likely to spark much further discussion of an under-explored but very important topic (or set of topics).

The volume has four main parts. The first explores the roles that copies and copying behavior play in human life. Dieter Birnbacher focuses on the question of why we might value an original over a copy, drawing particular attention to the puzzle of how perfect qualitative copies can differ from originals with respect to any robust sense of value, given that it seems that such value would have to supervene on qualitative properties. Mark Alfino calls into question the applicability of the post-Enlightenment conception of copyright by arguing that copying behavior -- again, very broadly construed -- is central to human identity, both cultural and personal, and indeed has not only played a substantial role in our evolutionary development, but continues to play a role in our ability to flourish and form senses of self. Concluding Part I is Wybo Houkes, who picks up on Alfino's evolutionary themes (with welcome methodological reminders of the potential pitfalls of evolutionary storytelling and the prescriptive capacities of evolutionary approaches to ethics). After advancing the claim that our evolutionary history does little-to-nothing to ground the belief that copying is a moral wrong, Houkes considers whether there are morally relevant differences between adaptive imitative behavior and copying abilities made possible by newer technology, such as the indiscriminate downloading of media content. Among his conclusions is that moral distaste for downloading may come not from any legitimate objection to copying per se, but instead from the fact that the act fails to "facilitat[e] cumulative cultural change" and potentially also "[increases] technological dependence" and "overindulgence" (p. 53).

Part II focuses primarily on issues of ontology and conceptual analysis. Maria Elisabeth Reicher discusses the relevance of ontology to copyright law, and also, importantly, the relevance of copyright law to ontology. After all, if our ontology of works (conceived here to include not only artworks, but works of science, design, etc.) must be informed by our practices, we would do well to not ignore the robust legal aspects of those practices. Reicher's ambitious essay is aimed at providing a legally informed, general ontology of such works. Amrei Bahr continues in a similar (and similarly ambitious) vein, offering an ontology and conceptual analysis of the notion of an artifact copy -- that is, a copy of an artifact that is itself also an artifact. Massimiliano Carrara carefully distinguishes between copies and replicas and fine-tunes a disjunctive notion of counterfeit, not in terms of copying per se, but instead in terms of both (i) misleading ascriptions of historical properties and (ii) illegitimately produced replicas. Finally, Hick contributes a meta-ontological reflection on the conditions under which one might be able to produce a truly ontologically novel work, with the example here being a hypothetical literary work that, by stipulation, does not admit of authentic copies. Drawing on work by Sherri Irvin (2005) and Amie Thomasson (2010), Hick explores what he calls ontological revolution, arguing that the possibility of such a singular literary work ultimately depends on both the actions of the artist and collective uptake by the artworld.

The third part focuses on aesthetic and legal issues within particular art forms. Annette Gilbert offers an informative discussion of the ways in which publishers can violate authors' authority over their own work, concluding with an examination of the reconceptualization of authors as those who make books rather than merely write texts, and hence rightly have authority over matters of presentation. James O. Young provides a series of arguments -- aesthetic, moral, and ontological -- for the claim that, contrary to contemporary legal practice, fictional characters should be protected not under copyright or trademark law, but instead under less stringent patent law. In discussing several court decisions regarding the legal protection of works of fiction which borrow material from works of non-fiction, David Oels argues that, in legal matters, the distinction between fiction and non-fiction should be treated as graded, rather than absolute, and that we would do well to take seriously the creative achievement of not just the generation of content, but of the presentation of content, as well. Lisa Jones offers a discussion of appropriation art (broadly construed, so as to include instances of appropriation in popular music) and argues that some instances of appropriation -- such as Vanilla Ice's appropriation of musical elements of David Bowie and Queen's "Under Pressure" -- can fail insofar as they result in the aesthetic derogation of the works from which they appropriate. Jan Bäcklund explores issues surrounding the plagiarizing of not particular works but particular styles. Eberhard Ortland focuses on the legal battle surrounding Pharrell Williams and Robin Thicke's "Blurred Lines" and its similarities to Marvin Gaye's "Got To Give It Up," arguing that, without settled answers on which aspects of a work are central to its identity, current practice erroneously and problematically leaves important legal decisions regarding copyright up to the aesthetic bias of the jury.

Part IV investigates an ethics of copying in a digital age. Thomas Dreier offers a wonderfully informative survey of the legal and ethical foundations of copyright law and its international counterparts, with an eye toward the complications raised by developments in both technology (Facebook, YouTube, etc.) and the artworld (conceptual art, appropriation art, etc.). In a similarly informative essay, Lionel Bently puts forth a brief survey of international legal takes on the notion of self-copying, and argues that, at best, the possible ethical foundations of copyright law more generally justify only very weak restrictions on authors' reuse of their own previous material. Charles Melvin Ess contributes an examination of different conceptions of the self that arise from both broadly Western approaches and Chinese Confucian approaches before considering how we might apply a system of virtue ethics to contemporary discussions of the copying of digital artifacts.

In an empirically focused essay, Aram Sinnreich discusses the results of a series of quantitative and qualitative surveys on variation in international attitudes toward the legality, morality, and aesthetic merit of various kinds of copying developed in the digital age (mash-ups, remixes, etc.). Jakub Macek and Pavel Zahrádka, in a similar discussion of the results of quantitative and qualitative studies conducted in the Czech Republic, provide a nuanced interpretation of how Czech citizens view themselves when engaging with pirated digital content. Macek and Zahrádka argue that those surveyed do not take themselves to be subverting the law, nor do they seem to be engaging in some kind of post hoc rationalization to justify behavior that they "really" understand to be morally wrong. Instead, the suggestion is that, in light of new and developing technologies, we are seeing the emergence of a genuinely new ethical framework. These themes are taken up again in Schmücker's contribution, which admirably synthesizes much of the volume's content in an attempt to establish foundations for an ethics of copying. Rather than working from generalized normative principles, Schmücker's aim is to advance applied, domain-specific principles which do justice to the various complications discussed throughout the volume as a whole.

As mentioned above, the volume concludes with a "coda," in which Hans Nieswandt, a professional DJ, builds on the volume's occasional theme of copying as a potentially beneficial or virtuous act. After offering reflection on the phenomenon of disco edits, Nieswandt concludes that "editmaking can and should be a way of honoring the original," elaborating further that he himself "take[s] it as a compliment" (pp. 390-391).

As is made clear by even the brief summaries just offered, there is a lot of ground covered here. Nonetheless, beyond the theme of copying as a potentially beneficial or virtuous act, at least two other distinct themes emerge. The first is that the contemporary legal handling of matters of copying and of intellectual property more generally is largely inadequate. Whether we look backward (as most prominently discussed in the essays by Alfino and Houkes) at the positive role that copying and copying behavior have played (and continue to play) in human culture and development, or look forward (as most prominently discussed in the essays by Oels, Jones, Dreier, Ess, Sinnreich, Macek and Zahrádka, and Schmücker) at technological and artistic advancements that make copying of various varieties more and more commonplace and attitudes toward such behavior more and more relaxed, we see reasons to seriously reconsider both the letter and the spirit of relevant legal restrictions.

If a foundational motivation for some legal restrictions on copying is to promote creativity and innovation, then many aspects of such restrictions may actually undercut such motivations by stifling those very things. This possibility plays a prominent role in Young's essay, in which a crucial part of the argument is that, by placing fictional characters in the domain of entities protected by copyright law (rather than under patent law, as Young goes on to propose), we unduly restrict the abilities of authors to create new works of potential aesthetic merit based on characters other than their own creations. Relaxing the current -- and quite stringent -- restrictions on the appropriation of characters could (and would, Young speculates) make possible (and perhaps even likely) more fully-developed literary or cinematic works of merit that might otherwise be left as under-developed pieces of fan fiction, if anything at all. Of course, this proposal naturally leads us into the concerns about aesthetic derogation introduced in Jones's essay: if, when working on my attempt at a literary masterpiece, I appropriate a previously well-established, beloved character but then end up producing the literary equivalent (in terms of both cultural impact and aesthetic merit) of "Ice Ice Baby" (in which the appropriated character is analogous to the appropriated musical elements), then I run the risk of doing some variety of aesthetic harm to the character and, also quite possibly, to the previous works within which that character has appeared. Such cases -- which, I speculate now, might not be entirely uncommon were Young's proposal to be taken up -- would need to be considered when evaluating the pros and cons of his suggestion. Young briefly discusses an objection along these lines (p. 165), but more consideration of the intersection between the upshot of his essay and the upshot of Jones's would be fruitful.

A further theme is that ontology matters. Beyond the more overtly ontology-focused essays by Birnbacher, Reicher, Bahr, Carrara, and Hick, such considerations also play not insignificant roles in the essays by Young, Jones, Ortland, and Dreier. As part of the support for his suggestion that characters are handled inadequately by current copyright law, Young argues (pp. 158-161) that, whereas copyright law protects works, characters simply do not enjoy work status. Nor, for that matter, are they at all on an ontological par with works (in the relevant sense, including the sorts of works in which characters tend to appear), since such works characteristically admit of instances, and characters, Young contends, are just not the sort of entities that can admit of instances. Instead, characters are tools to use in the generation of such works. Ultimately, Young's remarks about characters cast them as quite similar, ontologically, to the picture we get in recent discussion by Anthony Everett and Timothy Schroeder (2015), who argue that fictional characters are best understood as ideas for stories. Given the complicated relationship between intellectual property law and mere ideas, however, the otherwise quite natural adoption of Everett and Schroeder's ontology as a foundation for Young's conception of characters would prompt further discussion on how to better approach the legal protection of mere ideas.

Similar issues, pertaining to the relationship between ideas and works of conceptual art, arise in Dreier's discussion, which claims that

In conceptual art, what counts is the idea which is located, so to speak, outside of the picture frame, i.e. of what's physically visible. But according to copyright logic, mere ideas are not protected. Conceptual art is then either not covered by copyright laws (which would run counter to copyright's fundamental ethical aim to protect the authors of artistic works), or the concept of "idea" would have to be redefined for purposes of copyright (which would result in a change of fundamental copyright ideas and its underlying ethical rules). (p. 264)

Here, Dreier is assuming what Peter Goldie and Elisabeth Schellekens (2009) have called the idea idea: that is, the ontological thesis according to which conceptual artworks are best taken to be ideas. Though many (including Matheson (2013), Cray (2014), Hanson (2015), and Dodd (2017)) have raised serious concerns about the idea idea, Dreier's remarks make salient the fact that ontological considerations of the relationships between works and ideas are of central importance when considering issues of intellectual property, again drawing particular attention to the question of how best to think about the quite different legal treatment of works and ideas in contexts in which we might be tempted (for better or for worse) to identify the two.

Continuing with ontological themes, Jones contends that considerations of singular vs. multiple works are relevant to determining if and when aesthetic derogation takes place, while Ortland's worries about which aspects of a musical work are relevant for determining whether legally objectionable copying has occurred add a certain gravity to detailed discussions of the ontology of recorded music found elsewhere by, inter alia, Davies (2001), Gracyk (1996), and Kania (2006). Like Reicher (p. 62-63), I take these considerations to all strongly support the claim that the ontology of art (and, for that matter, of artifacts broadly construed) is not just of interest to the ontologist, but is also of legitimate legal importance, as well.

Reicher emphasizes a related point:

Copyright law and jurisdiction provide a considerable amount of data that should be taken into account by an ontology of works. If such an ontology were in conflict with relevant and widely accepted parts of copyright law and/or approved jurisdiction, this would be a prima facie reason against it . . . Thus, if, for instance, an ontological theory that implied that works are material objects were in conflict with copyright law and jurisdiction, this would be a prima facie reason to reject such a "materialist" ontology. (p. 62)

This methodological sentiment—implicitly echoed throughout the volume—suggests an inclination toward what Mag Uidhir (2013: 3) has called Independence, a methodological approach according to which (roughly) practice-based considerations are privileged over considerations of metaphysical orthodoxy, with a preference for revising the latter before the former. This approach can be contrasted with Deference, according to which (again, roughly) considerations of metaphysical orthodoxy take priority over practice-based considerations. (The distinction between Independence and Deference is closely related to the distinction between descriptivism and revisionism in the ontology of art; for detailed discussion of this latter distinction, see, inter alia, Thomasson 2006, Kania 2008, Dodd 2013, and D. Davies 2009, 2017. For a discussion of Reciprocity, an alternative to both Independence and Deference, see again Mag Uidhir 2013.) For those with Deferential or revisionist (or, at the very least, anti-Independent) inclinations, much of the ontology done here—involving the invocation of creatable abstract artifacts, non-standard mereologies, ontological revolution, and the like—might seem methodologically ill-conceived. Reicher’s point, however, is an important one for all sides of these methodological debates: no matter what role or level of priority we assign to the practice when doing ontology, we do no one any favors when we fail to seriously consider the legal aspect of that practice.

To sum up: this is a volume of significant merit. It should be read by anyone interested in aesthetic, cultural, ethical, legal, or ontological considerations pertaining to copying, broadly construed.


Thanks to Sam Cowling, John Harris, and Kelly McCormick for helpful comments.


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