The Agnostic Inquirer: Revelation from a Philosophical Standpoint

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Sandra Menssen and Thomas D. Sullivan, The Agnostic Inquirer: Revelation from a Philosophical Standpoint, Wm. B. Eerdmans Publishing Company, 2007, 331pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780802803948.

Reviewed by Keith M. Parsons, University of Houston, Clear Lake


Sandra Menssen and Thomas D. Sullivan oppose the methods traditionally employed in the philosophical defense of Christian theism and propose what they believe will be a more fruitful approach.  In this review, I characterize their project and part of its rationale and then argue that, when addressed to its intended audience, Menssen and Sullivan's strategy is no more likely to succeed than the traditional one.

As its title indicates, this book address the "agnostic inquirer," that is, one who does not believe that there is a God, but inquires, "Is there a good God who has revealed anything to us?"  (Somewhat idiosyncratically, the authors use the term "agnostic" broadly to include all who do not believe in God.)  Menssen and Sullivan argue that, instead of giving a direct answer, defenders of Christian theism have traditionally begun by addressing the prior question "Is there a God?"  The traditional apologetic modus operandi begins with the arguments of natural theology, which, by appealing only to natural human reason, aim to establish the preliminaries of faith, namely, that God exists and possesses certain attributes.  Then, once these preliminaries are believed secure, arguments are given to validate the credentials of the Christian revelation.  In this way, it is hoped, the strongest objection of unbelievers -- that there is no God and hence no Christian revelation -- can be overcome by the sheer force of argument and the doubter's mind thereby prepared to receive the appeal to revelation.  According to Menssen and Sullivan, this has been the prevailing procedure of philosophers when presenting a case for Christian theism to unbelievers (p. 52ff).  The authors aim to promote an alternative apologetic strategy that will put revelatory claims foremost and omit the usual propaedeutic of theistic proofs or evidences.

Despite its venerability and its stellar cast of practitioners, Menssen and Sullivan regard the traditional approach as ineffective and based on a fallacious assumption, what they call proposition p:

One cannot obtain a convincing philosophical case for a revelatory claim without first obtaining a probable case for a good God (a case that renders the proposition more probable than not). (p. 52)

The fallacy behind p, they claim, is the assumption that you cannot answer a complex question until you have answered the embedded simpler questions:

Why is it routinely supposed that the nearly universal assumption about order expressed by proposition p is correct?  Logical considerations about complex questions can appear to support it.  In general, it may seem, if you are trying to answer a complex question, you must first answer any embedded simpler questions …  The question of whether a good God has vouchsafed a revelation to humankind appears to presuppose a positive answer to the question "Is there a good God?" (pp. 58-59)

But, say Menssen and Sullivan, complex questions often may be answered before simpler embedded questions.  They cite as an example the planet Neptune, the discovery of which occurred after astronomers J.C. Adams and U.J. Leverrier had calculated that perturbations in the orbit of Uranus might be caused by a trans-Uranian planet located in a certain part of the sky.  In 1846 observers at the Berlin Observatory examined that portion of the sky and quickly discovered Neptune.  This shows, say Menssen and Sullivan, that the embedded proposition, "There is a heavenly body beyond Uranus," can be established by confirming the more complex proposition, "There is a heavenly body beyond Uranus that is perturbing its orbit" (p. 59).

It is unlikely that a proponent of p will be persuaded by this argument.  There is no reason to think that, with the evidence and arguments then available, it would have been any harder to convince members of the astronomical community of 1846 that "There is a heavenly body beyond Uranus that is perturbing its orbit" than to establish the simpler embedded proposition "There is a heavenly body beyond Uranus."  By contrast, when arguing with agnostic inquirers, it may be much harder to convince them of a particular revelatory claim, say, "God exists and was incarnate in Jesus Christ" than to persuade them to accept the embedded proposition "God exists."  It is fair to say that for many agnostic inquirers, while the prior probability of "God exists" will be quite low, "God exists and was incarnate in Jesus Christ" will be much lower still.  Further, the arguments aimed at validating particular claimed revelations are often viewed as looser and less rigorous than those purporting to establish theism per se.  The traditional allegiance of philosophical theists to p is therefore more likely to be a matter of rhetorical strategy -- using the arguments deemed most likely to persuade -- than due to a fallacious assumption.

Menssen and Sullivan also claim that an additional advantage of their alternative is that it provides better resources for handling the problem of evil (p. 46ff).  The reason is that, in their view, an adequate theodicy would have to establish at least the possibility of an afterlife.  Even if the agnostic inquirer concedes that possibly God could not have created a world with a better balance of good and evil than this one, he or she could reasonably maintain that, in that case, God should not have created any world.  Yet if the inquirer could be convinced that the present world is possibly not the only one, but that a better one possibly awaits, where wrongs will be redressed, then this makes it harder to opt for no creation.  Yet, say Menssen and Sullivan, the philosophical arguments for an afterlife are weak and unlikely to persuade the agnostic (pp. 50-51).  Still, the reality of an afterlife in which evil is redeemed might be revealed, and the agnostic might be persuaded to accept the plausibility of this revelatory claim.

Here again, though, the purported advantage over the traditional approach is not apparent.  Whether a particular revelatory claim about the afterlife is a hindrance or a help to a theodicist depends crucially upon its content, and, obviously, Menssen and Sullivan cannot make prior guarantees about that.  For instance, orthodox claims about an eternal, punitive hell as the destiny of most humans would, prima facie, be a hard sell, making the job of theodicy much more difficult.

Menssen and Sullivan, however, do not take on the job of promoting any particular revelatory claims.  Their aim is to pursue the meta-inquiry of validating a strategy for providing an affirmative answer to the agnostic inquirer's question of whether there is a good God who has revealed anything (p. 6).  Their strategy is to defend what they call the "Key Argument," which goes as follows:

(1) If it is not highly unlikely that a world-creator exists, then investigation of the contents of revelatory claims might well show that it is probable that a good God exists and has revealed.

(2) It is not highly unlikely that a world-creator exists.

(3) So, investigation of the content of a revelatory claim might well show it is probable that a good God exists and has revealed.

(4) So, a negative conclusion concerning the existence of a good God is not justified unless the content of a reasonable number of leading revelatory claims has been seriously considered. (p. 63)

The remainder of the book consists of careful argument in defense of this strategy, argument so detailed that an adequate summary is impossible in a short review.  The many topics they consider include the idea that the world could be uncaused or self-caused (pp. 94-108), whether an immaterial mind can interact with the physical order (pp. 108-116), the problem of evil and the goodness of God (pp. 123-170), criteria for the evaluation of revelatory claims (pp. 171-223), and many other issues.  The treatment of the relevant topics is impressively comprehensive.  Also, though the text is argument-dense, it is clearly written and logically organized.

This, then, is the nature of Menssen and Sullivan's project.  How effective is it?  Would the strategy they propose be more likely to persuade agnostic inquirers than the traditional apologetic?  The present reviewer is one of the inquirers whom they address (though I term myself an atheist rather than an agnostic).  Of course, I can only speak for myself, but it seems likely that many other inquirers would have responses similar to mine.  I find so much to disagree with here that to lodge all of my objections would require a book larger than Menssen and Sullivan's.  I shall therefore focus on just two small points.  Though these points play minor roles in the overall argument, the book contains literally hundreds of such points where agnostic inquirers are likely to take strong exception.  Therefore, I conclude that the Menssen and Sullivan approach to apologetics is no more likely to succeed with its intended audience than the traditional one.

An agnostic inquirer in Menssen and Sullivan's sense is likely to be, at least, a methodological physicalist, that is, one who, as a matter of methodological or heuristic principle, requires that physical phenomena be explained exclusively in terms of hypotheses postulating physical entities, forces, or processes.  One chief motivator of physicalism as a methodological or heuristic principle has been the longstanding and intractable difficulty of understanding how an immaterial entity, like God or a Cartesian mind, could cause a physical effect, e.g., by making a piece of matter move.  Menssen and Sullivan admit that we have no idea how mind can move matter (p. 108), and they reply with a tu quoque:  We have no idea how matter moves matter.  Hence, they imply, it is unreasonable to reject supernatural causal explanations on the grounds that they are less informative than physical ones.  With all forms of causality we are stuck where Hume left us, with nothing more than an account of consistent conjunction.

We should not be frightened by Hume's ghost.  Much of the success of science is due to the fact that it progressively acquires ever deeper and richer causal accounts of natural phenomena.  We now possess many well-confirmed and copiously detailed explanations of how physical effects are brought about.  Indeed, one of the major challenges facing a student in a field such as molecular biology is the sheer weight of detail that has to be mastered to comprehend how molecular processes accomplish their effects.  Perhaps Menssen and Sullivan would reply that such accounts, however detailed, merely scratch the surface and do not tell us what is really, fundamentally going on when physical causation occurs.  At the most basic level, they might claim, at the level of our theories of fundamental forces and their interactions, all we can say is that things do happen in a given way.

But the point is precisely that with many scientific causal accounts, there is a great wealth of explanatory detail before we reach causal bedrock.  Even at the presumably rock-bottom level of quarks, electrons, and photons we have well-confirmed, mathematically precise theories, like quantum electrodynamics, that often make astonishingly accurate predictions.  These theories do not just tell us that fundamental particles interact, but give us much information about the way that they do.  With supernatural causal explanations, on the other hand, our inquiry simply hits a wall.  An advocate of the Cartesian theory of mind can only say that mind does move things by a power which, as Menssen and Sullivan admit, is occult.  This is Owen Flanagan's point when he says that for the Cartesian the mind performs psychokinesis with every voluntary action (Flanagan, 2002, p. 58).  Theistic explanations are no better.  The evolutionary account of, say, the beginning of mammals is replete with factual and theoretical detail.  The creationist story, by contrast, can hardly improve upon the author of the first chapter of Genesis:  "God said 'Let there be … ,' and it was so."  Clearly, compared to the richness of many scientific causal accounts, supernatural causal scenarios are extremely exiguous in content.  Therefore, it is not unreasonable for methodological physicalists to demand naturalistic causal accounts.

Menssen and Sullivan also consider that an agnostic inquirer might object that theistic accounts of immaterial minds influencing matter violate the law of conservation of energy (p. 110).  They offer a variety of responses, one of which is to list a number of eminent physicists who, for one reason or another, advocated rejecting energy conservation.  One such eminent physicist they mention is Niels Bohr (p. 111).  According to Allan Franklin, in 1929 Bohr began to speculate about energy nonconservation in response to careful experiments conducted by C.D. Ellis and W.A. Wooster involving the phenomenon of beta decay, the disintegration of an atomic nucleus to produce a high-speed electron, or beta particle (Franklin, pp. 68-69).  In a 1930 lecture Bohr opined that the conservation of energy might not be applicable to beta decay disintegrations, though he admitted that departing from that principle in this case would "imply strange consequences" (Franklin, p. 69).  Wolfgang Pauli would not accept the abandonment of energy conservation and soon proposed a brilliant but radical solution -- that the energy books are balanced by a particle with properties that would make it virtually unobservable, the neutrino.  According to George Gale, this proposed solution presented the physics community with a dilemma -- either to exempt Pauli's proposal from the usual verifiability requirements, or to reject the principle of conservation of energy (Gale, pp. 174-175).  In the end, physicists accepted the neutrino and kept the law of conservation of energy, though they did so at the price of violating a basic epistemological standard of physical science, namely, that the postulation of new theoretical entities be subject to rigorous experimental or observational verification.

The lesson here seems to be that physicists are loath, and rightly so, to dispense with so fundamental a principle as the law of conservation of energy and are willing to consider doing so only when they are under duress, that is, when every other alternative seems even more desperate.  It is reasonable to consider abandoning the law of energy conservation when, for instance, we are faced with established experimental results that seem compatible with no feasible alternative interpretation.  Energy conservation is not a principle to be tossed away lightly, say because theists and dualists have an ax to grind.

I have indicated only two very minor points where agnostic inquirers such as myself are likely to take strong exception to the arguments of Menssen and Sullivan.  However, there are hundreds of such points in Menssen and Sullivan's book that would likely elicit objections this strong or stronger.  I conclude that their new apologetic approach is no more likely to sway the intended audience than the old one did.


Flanagan, O., The Problem of the Soul, (2002), New York: Basic Books.

Franklin, A., Are There Really Neutrinos?, (2001), Cambridge, MA: Perseus Books.

Gale, G., The Theory of Science, (1979), New York: McGraw-Hill.