The Analysis of Wonder: An Introduction to the Philosophy of Nicolai Hartmann

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Predrag Cicovacki, The Analysis of Wonder: An Introduction to the Philosophy of Nicolai Hartmann, Bloomsbury, 2014, 168pp., $110.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781623567903.

Reviewed by Sebastian Luft, Marquette University


If I may, I'll begin my review of this short and elegant book on the philosophy of Nicolai Hartmann (1882-1950) with some brief reminiscing. When I did my undergraduate studies at the University of Heidelberg in the early 1990s, "Hartmann" was very much a name that was recognized by the professoriate. Indeed, his philosophy was invoked as a matter of course in discussions, when it came to problems in ontology, in theories of value, especially, alongside Martin Heidegger, Max Scheler, Karl Jaspers and others. As is clear from the writings of Heidegger, of Gadamer, of other members of the Marburg School (where Hartmann taught 1919-1925) and representatives of the phenomenological movement, Hartmann was considered one of the first-rate thinkers of his time. Unlike many of his contemporaries, he neither sided with the Nazis during the dark period of German history, such that his philosophy might as well be considered non grata (indeed, he was almost disturbingly unconcerned by the turmoil around him), nor was he forced to leave during that period. Indeed, he "stuck around" all the time, sailing his course seemingly unperturbed by his times and indifferent to being popular or not. All the while, he had a most successful professorial career, ascending to an Ordinariat at the age of 37 in Marburg (Heidegger, who first held the position of Professor extraordinarius in Marburg, succeeded Hartmann after his departure in 1925). After Marburg, Hartmann taught in Cologne until 1930 (succeeding Scheler there), then Berlin 1931-1945. He finished his career in Göttingen 1945-1950, where he died in the midst of plans for publishing further work, which appeared posthumously. By all accounts, he had a formidable career and was considered one of the top representatives of German philosophy.

How could such a well-established name become so completely forgotten?  The question may seems too obvious, but it is one of the questions motivating Predrag Cicovacki in this provocative volume. Given Hartmann's lengthy tomes (consider only the massive Ethik), the volume is thankfully slim, and complete with a timeline of Hartmann's life and a bibliography of his works. It succeeds in being a splendid introduction for the English-speaking world, especially since hardly anything of Hartmann's oeuvre is translated into English.[1] Cicovacki is clearly on top of this entire oeuvre, which he presents in three parts, Part I (Being), Part II (Values) and Part III (Personality), representing the main topics Hartmann pondered. Regardless of what one makes of Hartmann's philosophy in systematic terms, one needs to point out the peculiar position of his thought in his day. Beginning his career in Marburg, surrounded by the well-established Neo-Kantians and, a bit later, by the young Heidegger, who was at the time building his philosophical system that would culminate in Being and Time (1927), Hartmann is curiously the "odd man out." He was seemingly unfazed by these developments occurring around him, which may account, at least in part, for his relative neglect by subsequent philosophers. The latter followed the big names of the time, whereas Hartmann seems not to have attracted a great number of followers, nor did he seem to care to.[2] His thought revolved around the big planets in the Western philosophical universe (such as Plato, Aristotle, the Neo-Platonists, Leibniz), ignoring the falling stars in between.

Does Cicovacki succeed in making Hartmann palatable for today's taste? "Does Hartmann matter?" is, indeed, the question with which he opens the discussion. Cicovacki announces that he will use different "measuring sticks" to assess whether Hartmann matters, one of which is Jaspers' division of "all major philosophers" into three main categories: "(1) the 'pragmatic individuals' (such as Buddha, Confucius, Socrates and Jesus); (2) the great thinkers at the borders of philosophy and other realms of human experience (e.g., Goethe, Dostoevsky, Tolstoy); and (3) the great philosophical thinkers" (cited, p. 5). Group 3 has four subcategories:

(3.1) the seminal thinkers, whose ideas have continued to bear fruit (Plato, St Augustine, Kant); (3.2) the intellectual visionaries and original metaphysicians (Parmenides, Heraclitus, Plotinus, Spinoza); (3.3) the 'great disturbers,' regardless of whether they were primarily the 'probing negators' (Abelard, Descartes, Hume), or the 'radical awakeners' (Pascal, Lessing, Kierkegaard, Nietzsche); and (3.4.) the 'creative orderers,' whose great systems are all the culmination of long developments (Aristotle, Aquinas, Hegel). (p. 5)

At the end of the treatise, we learn that, in Cicovacki's estimation, Hartmann is somewhat of a hybrid. He clearly belongs to category 3.4., the great systematizers, although Hartmann himself did not see himself in this light, and Cicovacki also hesitates to rank him with Aristotle and Hegel despite his "flashes of brilliance" (p. 157). At the same time, he also belongs to category 3.3., for he is also a "great disturber": "He offers an original metaphysical vision and attempts to act as an awakener" (p. 158).

Let us, then, attempt to understand this metaphysical vision, this "attempt to rediscover the real and develop an appreciation for it" (p. 160), which Cicovacki frames in terms of, as the title says, wonder. He quotes Hartmann admitting to his friend, the philosopher Heinz Heimsoeth, that he was "always in love and perpetually perplexed." This was not an expression of a biographical fact, nor does it entail, to Hartmann, a position of receptive passivity with respect to the cosmos, but instead a call to philosophical action, to analysis in the tradition of the Ancients. What, now, are the objects of Hartmann's wonder and how does he proceed?

Hartmann's philosophy can most appropriately be called, both in its approach to philosophical problems in general as well as in its aims, an ontology. Hence it is fitting to begin with the question of "being as being," as Cicovacki does in Part I (I shall confine my discussion here mainly to this central part). He begins by quoting one of Hartmann's key assertions: "Being itself is disharmonious, and conflict is the form of its being" (p. 7). As will become clear in what follows, this is not meant to be a speculative statement uttered from a view from nowhere, but rather the result of a consideration of being in its multiplicity. What is needed, then, is a careful analysis of being in its different shapes and forms. Indeed, Cicovacki reminds the reader that Hartmann has been counted among the phenomenologists in his endorsement of Husserl's famous call "back to the things themselves." This is true to the extent that Hartmann's mandate is to reawaken a (wondrous) appreciation of the wealth of reality ("A narrowing of the field of vision is the inveterate vice of philosophy," cited p. 10).

Where Hartmann differs from phenomenology, however, is that this turn to the objects in their wealth has nothing to do with their being phenomena, given to us, thus it is not about the subject's apprehending being but about being itself. Indeed, this understanding of the phenomenological battle cry is in accordance with the way in which the early phenomenologists understood it, as a call to return to reality. It is from this stance that the early followers of Husserl famously rejected Husserl's transcendental turn (to constituting subjectivity). It is important to note that Hartmann's ontology is equally based on a rejection of the Copernican turn.

Attending to the things themselves is, to repeat, no mere contemplative musing. Indeed, it is one of Hartmann's methodological "tools" to work with what he calls aporia, contradiction. For attending to things leads quickly to the discovery of contradictions, which are "like knots in wood" in the growing tree. They are not a matter of our incomprehension, but they exist out there, they are part of being itself. Trying to solve these aporiai leads to philosophical theory. Thus, we find a methodological triad in his approach to ontology: phenomena lead to problems (aporiai), which lead, in turn, to theory.[3] The way to theory leads, then, through dialectics, which is not an attempt to dissolve aporetic problems, but an appreciation of aporiai as part of reality itself. For this reason,

philosophy ends in dialectical thinking, which does not shun oppositions, contradictions, or even insoluble problems. . . . it thrives in them. . . . Philosophy [to Hartmann] is not a quest for certainty. It is not a product but a project. Despite its systematic and rigorous approach, philosophy does not prove anything. It probes. (p. 15)

Over the course of this chapter, Cicovacki lays out Hartmann's ontology, which he considers a part of metaphysics (in the Aristotelian sense), and which is situated, since being is a "neutral" category, "this side of idealism and realism" (p. 19). It is a standpoint not yet "'infected' by philosophical theories and their prejudices" (p. 19). Nonetheless, a complete grasp of reality will never be achieved by a complete system, yet what is called for is systematic philosophizing.[4] In his ontology, then, Hartmann distinguishes different layers of being, beginning with real and proceeding to ideal being with its multi-layered organization. For this reason, his ontology has also been called Schichtenontologie, stratified ontology. The strata are layered upon one another and consist in the inorganic, the organic, the psychic and the spiritual (cf. p. 30), which, however, may never be reduced to one another. In this context, Hartmann also rejects as naïve and removed from "concrete reality" the traditional dualism between two substances, such as body and mind. "The real concrete life, with its constant blending of the two spheres, is not to be understood in this manner" (cited p. 30).

This assessment of the human being in its "real concrete life" in the context of ontology also rejects anthropology as a discipline sui generis, possible without an ontological basis. It is a clear rejection of the Copernican turn, and also of a Heideggerian analysis of factical Dasein, taken as"fundamental ontology": "the nature of man can be adequately understood only as the integrated whole of combining strata and, furthermore, as placed within the totality of the same order of strata which, outside of man, determines the structure of the real world" (p. 33).[5] Thus, being is real, it is not mind-dependent, and we are part of it. Nothing privileges us and our being, but being allows itself to be systematically understood by us, because it is itself ordered systematically.

The work of ontology is essentially an uncovering of the categories of real being. These categories are arranged in pairs: the "fundamental" categories, which are common to all strata of real being, are "principle/concretum; structure/modus; form/matter; inner/outer; determination/dependence; quality/quantity; unity/manifoldness; harmony/conflict; contrast/dimension; discretion/continuity; substratum/relation; element/structure" (p. 38), which obey the four basic categorial laws (of validity, coherence, hierarchical order and dependence). The main insight, as formulated in the last law ("the dependence of categories is asymmetrical, with the higher categories dependent on the lower, though their categorial novelty is thereby not limited," p. 39), leads Hartmann to a fundamental ontological conviction, the recognition of the rootedness of real being. "Like the segments of a tree, the higher strata are rooted in the lower. All the strata are interconnected, without being reducible to one another" (p. 39).

Once again, these are categories of real being, not of human cognition, which leads Hartmann to a somewhat pragmatic assessment of epistemology. Man knows things by means of his categories, but he does not need a knowledge of these categories for the purpose. . . . Knowledge of categories does not come until epistemology develops, but knowledge of things does not have to wait for epistemology" (p. 41), once again echoing his view of the philosopher as someone who tends to be misled by his "theoretical prejudices," which lead him away from an appreciation of being "as it really is." Accordingly, cognition is not a construction or any other theoretical act, but Erfassung, grasping of the real, both physically (from which the word fassen, grasping, is derived) as well as mentally, a grasping, however, which is never complete; systematic, but never arriving at a closed system. This systematic approach is surely a process in time, but it is a timeless grasping of real being. It is, to quote Gadamer's acerbic phrase aimed  (unfairly) at the Neo-Kantians and,among others, Hartmann (fairly), a grasping of problems that "exist like stars in the sky" (p. 58), removed from our daily business in living and philosophizing.

Other areas of being, besides "real being," are the being of values and that of persons, which is the reason Hartmann's ontology extends to value theory and personalism. In his value theory, Hartmann is, as he himself admits, quite close to the value theory developed in the 19th century by Hermann Lotze and later carried on by the members of the Southwest School of Neo-Kantianism. The book ends with a short chapter on Personality, which is the systematic summary of Hartmann's thinking. Caught between real being and the being of values, the human being emerges in the "unique richness and depth of human personality" (p. 145). Hartmann's thought here centers on the idea of the fulfillment of personality. This is a matter strictly speaking of the human being. "Grounded in the strata of real being and positioned at the spiritual level of that structure, a human person is the only being capable of responding to the world in a way that brings about the realization of values and bestows meaning" (p. 145). In the midst of being, becoming a person is a task that is to be fulfilled.

The highest fulfillment of personality is, according to Hartmann, found in love; "the mystery of love is that it satisfies this deepest and least understood craving" (p. 145). The type of love he has in mind is personal love, which means both love of someone else as a person as well as fulfillment of one's own personality in love; "in our nature there is a need to be loved. This is a genuine need, perhaps our deepest need, especially in view of the urge to give and bestow love and help another human being fulfill his own most primordial longing" (p. 146).  Here Cicovacki summarizes Hartmann's idea in poetic terms, emulating the poetic language Hartmann uses when it comes to this subject. Let us conclude with a last quotation of Hartmann: "The whole art of loving consists in retaining this high point of vision as a perspective and remaining under its spell. A life of love is a life spent in the knowledge of what is best worth knowing, a life of participation in the highest that is in man" (p. 152).

These words, written in his Ethics of 1926, bear an uncanny resemblance to Scheler's writings about personhood as well as Husserl's in his late ethics, published clandestinely in the Japanese journal The Kaizo (in 1921) and also in his private notes at the time, now published in Husserliana XLII.[6] I emphasize this not to downplay Hartmann's achievements, but to call to mind how closely Hartmann was aligned with the thoughts on this matter of other thinkers at the time, which may call into question the view Hartmann had of himself as philosophizing for the sake of philosophia perennis. This is not a weakness (though it would be to him), but to the contrary, allows us to see that his thought is more easily connectable to other traditions that might be more on people's minds today.

This brings us, finally, back to the question Cicovacki opens the book with: is Hartmann a thinker for us today? Can we read him today with interest and benefit? To answer these questions, let me turn to the author's achievement in this brief book. Cicovacki has presented us with an interesting and concise summary of Hartmann's thought in systematic presentation. One thing he certainly shows convincingly is that Hartmann is an extremely original thinker despite his rather traditional topics, in which he converses with timeless figures in the history of Western thought. But Cicovacki is also sensitive to contemporary readings of Hartmann and the critiques of Hartmann's own contemporaries, such as Heidegger, Cassirer, and Gadamer, which he judiciously cites, while also offering fair rejoinders from Hartmann's perspective. Cicovacki succeeds, clearly, in presenting Hartmann as fascinating thinker in his own right as well as in contextualizing him with philosophy both in his time and today.

Where might Hartmann's ideas be fruitful today? Certainly, contemporary work in ontology might be interested in Hartmann's ontology of strata, his categorial system and his dialectical method of uncovering and solving problems. The basic thesis that being consists in contradiction, or has knots like a tree, is an interesting starting point for any mapping of reality.  As we have seen, this was not, to Hartmann, a dogmatic stipulation but rather his discovery after studying reality in its richness.

Furthermore, Hartmann's ontology is a clear rejection of any transcendental philosophy, either of Kantian, Neo-Kantian or phenomenological stripe, and he also rejects Heideggerian fundamental ontology. Hartmann develops his views in confrontation with these figures, although he seldom cites them directly; nevertheless, the objects of his criticism becomes clear to the connaisseur. For challenges of the highest quality to these other traditions, Hartmann will certainly be an interesting interlocutor, if one manages to bring him into conversation with these figures (very much against his own procedure).

Finally, to quote the assessment of Daniel Dahlstrom in the recent volume on Hartmann, the latter is to be commended for his "courage and modesty" (Mut und Demut)[7] in taking up his innermost philosophical task. In adhering to this task, he is remarkably "untimely," unconcerned with his present, but for that reason, perhaps, timely for anybody daring to take up the thread of the thought he initiated.

In conclusion, Cicovacki offers a handy and easy-to-read introduction to a difficult and original thinker. The prose is clear and lucid. For anyone wanting to rediscover a giant of the 20th century, this book is an excellent place to start, and for deeper and more scholarly penetration, it deserves to be read in tandem with the new collection of essays edited by Gerald Hartung, Matthias Wunsch, and Claudius Strube, Von der Systemphilosophie zur systematischen Philosophie -- Nicolai Hartmann, of 2012 (all, however, in German).

[1] It appears that of the central writings, only the Ethik is translated. Apart from that, a search brought up only scattered essays. There is some recent interest in the philosophy of Hartmann in Germany; cf. the volume collecting the proceedings of a conference in Wuppertal in 2011, ed. by G. Hartung, M. Wunsch, C. Strube, Von der Systemphilosophie zur systematischen Philosophie  --  Nicolai Hartmann, Berlin: DeGruyter, 2012. I will refer to this volume later.

[2] Gadamer reports, in his Philosophical Apprenticeships, one of the "strategies" that Heidegger used to lure students away from Hartmann: being a nocturnal creature, Hartmann would lead discussion groups with students until well after midnight. Gadamer recalls: "Our evening discussions, in which Hartmann brought together a circle of students, began at about seven o'clock but revealed themselves in their full brilliance only after midnight. When Heidegger came to Marburg and scheduled his lectures for seven o'clock in the morning, conflict became unavoidable, and we ceased to be worth much after midnight in Hartmann's circle." (Quoted in Philosophical Apprenticeships, Cambridge: MIT Press, 1985, p. 13). At any rate, Hartmann does not seem to have cared all that much and certainly did not "retaliate." Another anecdote reported, once again by Gadamer, is telling with regard to his care for his students. "We had learned from [Heidegger] what a lecture could be, and I hope that none us of us has forgotten. I recall a telling incident that occurred when, as a young Ordinarius in Leipzig, I visited Nicolai Hartmann in Berlin for the first time. . . . He was very condescending and started by asking: 'Well, what's doing with philosophy in Leipzig? Anything happening?' And then he continued soothingly: 'Hans-Georg, tell me, what are your four lectures there?' Astounded, I asked what he meant. I did not have just four lectures; every one I read was different. He, then, in response: 'But Hans-Georg, that's sheer exploitation!'" (ibid., pp. 37 f.).

[3] Cf. p. 11, note 5, where the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy article "Nicolai Hartmann" by Roberto Poli is cited.

[4] Thus, the title of the anthology by Hartung, Wunsch, Strube (quoted above), "from system philosophy to systematic philosophy."

[5] These are perhaps sentences Merleau-Ponty could agree with. On Hartmann's relation to Heidegger, who was repeatedly very critical of Hartmann, Daniel Dahlstrom (in Hartung, Wunsch, Strube, op. cit., p. 365) recalls that Hartmann tried to convince the ministry of education in Berlin to offer Heidegger a position in Berlin. Heidegger received the call but rejected the offer in favor of his Heimat Freiburg.

[6] Edmund Husserl, Aufsätze und Vorträge (1911-1921),
ed. Thomas Nenon and Hans Rainer Sepp (Husserliana XXVII), Springer 1987, and Grenzprobleme der Phänomenologie, ed. Rochus Sowa and Thomas Vongehr (Husserliana XLII), Springer 2014.

[7] Op. cit., pp. 359f.