The Ancient Commentators on Plato and Aristotle

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Miira Tuominen, The Ancient Commentators on Plato and Aristotle, Acumen, 2009, xii + 324pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780520260276.

Reviewed by Harold Tarrant, University of Newcastle



The first question that I cannot avoid when trying to review this book is whether any academic book should be trying to match its content with its title. If the book were truly about “the ancient commentators on Plato and Aristotle” then one might have expected some detailed treatment of at least one figure who wrote a commentaryon Plato that has, at least in part, survived. There are five ancient commentators (other than anonymi) who fall into this category: first and foremost Proclus, from whom we have the bulk of commentaries on the Parmenides and Timaeus, more fragmentary commentaries on the Alcibiades and Cratylus, and an interpretative work on the Republic; also Syrianus, the man most accurately described as Proclus’ teacher (as by Proclus himself), though Tuominen mostly uses the term for Plutarch of Athens. Syrianus’ lectures on the Phaedrus have been preserved for us in a version by Hermeias. Then Calcidius, who translated and interpreted the high-profile parts of the Timaeus, though not known otherwise as a philosopher or commentator; next Damascius, from who we have commentaries on the Philebus, Phaedo, and Parmenides; finally Olympiodorus, from whom we have complete commentaries on the Alcibiades and Gorgias, and a fragmentary commentary on the Phaedo. Apart possibly from Syrianus, he was the only figure from antiquity who can be treated as a commentator on both Plato and Aristotle. The index of Tuominen’s book admits to mentioning Damascius once, Syrianus and Olympiodorus four brief times each, and Proclus a little more. However, since the books on Proclus’ philosophy by Beierwaltes and Siorvanes seem to go unmentioned in the bibliography, along with all of his Plato commentaries (and their editions and translations), other than On the Parmenides, one can perhaps legitimately claim that nothing in this book has to do with Platonic commentary.

Something of the reason for Proclus’ near-omission may be gleaned from p. 32, where we read “Proclus’ commentaries belong to the highest peak of the school curriculum, for students who are already well versed in Aristotle and in many of Plato’s other dialogues.” Admittedly the Timaeus and Parmenides were the final works to be read, but the Alcibiades­ was the very first Platonic dialogue to be studied, has been translated into both English and French, and could easily have been treated in the section on ethics. The author’s pleading suggests that she does not feel at all at home with the Plato commentators, and perhaps not with their bibliography either. It is thus not surprising that the cover’s endorsements are both from scholars primarily known for their work on the exegesis of Aristotle. Indeed the work does not serve badly as an introduction to the Greek commentators on Aristotle, whose study has blossomed under the direction of Richard Sorabji, although even here it necessarily has to be partial. Such an introduction was needed, and the fact that there is now something available that can perform the function is to be welcomed. Yet the almost exclusive attention to Aristotle has the unfortunate consequence that the core philosophy of most of the Aristotelian commentators, Platonism, is scarcely given the chance to raise its head. To treat Simplicius, for instance, without in some way recognizing the underlying commitment to generations of Platonist studies, is to tackle him with one hand tied behind one’s back.

One question that I had to ask from the beginning was whether the author had simply agreed to an inappropriate title, but always intended to write a work primarily about the interpretation of Aristotle. Much of the introduction seems to intend a more balanced treatment, e.g. p. 11: “All the Platonic commentators that we discuss here are writing after Plotinus.” It includes even-handed treatment of the recent debate involving Sorabji, Gerson, and Karamanolis on the ancient theory of the “harmony of Plato and Aristotle” (10). It acknowledges that the commentators do not share a single philosophy as such, but seeks to find “common practices, and sometimes also philosophical views” (9). The main aim of the book is said to be “to offer a philosophically focused introduction to the ancient commentators”. The intention seems broad, but I suspect that the method has placed its own constraints upon the subject-matter. As is stated early and evidenced throughout the book, discussions “start from generally recognized philosophical problems or themes” (15). This must tip the balance firmly in favour of Aristotle, since many Neoplatonists are regularly (but not exclusively) concerned with matters that no Stoic or Aristotelian could be expected to regard as philosophical problems, involving such esoteric matters as henads, progression and reversion, multiple divine levels, theurgy, Orphism, Chaldaean Oracles, and so on. The central concern of Neoplatonists from Iamblichus to Proclus and Damascius was theology, now normally regarded as being outside the domain of philosophy. Once we confine our attention to what everybody, ourselves included, can recognize as a philosophical problem, we confine ourselves to what the Platonists would have seen as material for discursive knowledge only, not for nous. Consequently, as we are given a historical summary that concludes the introduction, it emerges that the focus is going to fall mainly on Alexander, Simplicius, and Philoponus (and in the last case on his commentaries rather than the Christian treatises).

The remainder of the book, apart from a brief conclusion, is divided into chapters dealing with particular areas of philosophy, and therefore seeming to cover the main topics though in practice forced to rely on whatever is available. Chapter 2 deals with epistemology, beginning with discussion of the background in Plato’s Theaetetus and Aristotle’s Posterior Analytics, and other works. After an observation that Neoplatonic commentators "do not much concentrate on knowledge as discussed in the Theaetetus", that they concentrate on nous, anything specifically Platonist is quickly brushed aside along with Syrianus’ treatment of issues in Metaphysics IV, and we soon meet with a decision to treat principally material in Alexander, Themistius, and Philoponus on the Posterior Analytics, Metaphysics IV and De Anima (44-45). What would Tuominen have made of the lost Platonist commentaries on the Theaetetus, one wonders? What does she make of the references to the Theaetetus that are not so infrequent in surviving Proclan works? Admittedly we should still expect considerable discussion of nous there, but that is in the nature of the philosophy of the commentators as I understand it. The first problem of the chapter is that of infinity, the second that of perceptual relativism, which leads in time to that of the sense in which sensations are true. While the material chosen is usually well handled, I note the breathtaking statement that Cratylus the Heraclitean is to be distinguished from eponymous interlocutor of Plato’s Cratylus, a “fact” apparently missed by modern discussion of this work, and also the erroneous translation of hypolêpsis (non-cataleptic ‘assumption’) as ‘conception’ (53).

Chapter 3 is related, as it deals with science (here = epistêmê) and logic, and employs chiefly commentaries on the Analytics, Topics, and Categories. Here I have fewer qualms about the selection of materials, and the topic is well handled. Chapter 4 moves on to physics, where it is more troublesome that commentary on the hugely influential Timaeus, the penultimate (but in fact most popular) work of the Neoplatonist curriculum, is ignored. This is in spite of our having a significant amount of commentary on it from Galen, Calcidius (Latin), and above all the untiring Proclus, who preserves also substantial fragments of the commentaries of Porphyry, Iamblichus, and Syrianus. Here if anywhere there was an opportunity for some kind of balance between a Platonic work and an Aristotelian one, but we are not even told about the existence of such materials. What we are given is a reasonable account of how some features characteristic of Platonism, such as a hypostatic ‘nature’ that must (like souls) descend or a fifth paradigmatic cause, are present in late Neoplatonist commentaries on Aristotle from such figures as Philoponus and Simplicius.

Chapter 5 moves to psychology, but with a concentration on perception and intellect, which may be something of a surprise given the material treated in chapter 3, albeit from an epistemological perspective. The sources are principally the commentaries on the De Anima. Chapter 6 proceeds to metaphysics, where the commentaries on the Categories turn out to be the principal source. I am not quite sure why Olympiodorus (utilized on p. 208) is omitted from the list of commentators on the Categories, though nobody doubts his heavy dependence on Ammonius. The multiplicity and diversity of commentaries on this work do undoubtedly make it an excellent area in which to compare approaches.

Chapter 7 moves to ethics, which immediately creates questions regarding suitable source material. This is because "none of the main figures discussed in this book wrote a commentary on Aristotle’s Nicomachean Ethics that has been preserved to us." Could one add also that none of them wrote a commentary preserved to us on a work of Plato? Olympiodorus’ commentaries on the Alcibiades I, Gorgias, and (in part) Phaedo are preserved, but apparently they have no appropriate material. Aspasius is of course employed, but rather than use Platonist commentaries Tuominen brings in Simplicius’ Commentary on Epictetus and Porphyry’s On Abstinence. This comes after an admission that “the whole of Plato’s philosophy could be seen as ethical, and it could be said that the commentators did not need Aristotle in ethics as much as they did in natural philosophy, for example.” It seems to me that such a statement screams out for some balancing material from a Platonic commentary. The chapter involves sections on Function, good, and end; Does virtue entail happiness?; Are emotions part of a happy life?; Purification and instruments; Porphyry and Simplicius; Human community; and Porphyry: ascetic ideal and animal ethics. One has to be selective, and the material does illustrate something of the manner in which late antique philosophy operates. Perhaps the most important message in the chapter is that summed up in the rather brief conclusion as follows: “the commentators radically transform Aristotle’s idea according to which human beings are naturally sociable.” A shift is detected from the admission of human dependence on a community and common goals, to the demand for benevolent conduct to one’s fellow humans, and the avoidance of harm to animals that are not a threat (287).

The bibliography is disappointing in ways that go beyond its token nod towards the Platonic commentaries. It is not carefully designed to be of great help to readers, since of my own books it mentions only that which I should see as having least relevance to the area. Several scholars now prominent in the area are omitted altogether. And the section on ethics has only three worked listed, in spite of the increasing attention nowadays given to Neoplatonic ethics from both established and rising scholars. The volume Reading Plato in Antiquity (London 2006) contains two such studies, one by Luc Brisson and another my co-editor Dirk Baltzly. Also disappointing are the references: those that take a form such as "Alcinous, Didaskalikos, and Proclus in Parm." are simply not acceptable, particularly the latter since it runs to seven books (232)! An index locorum would have been helpful for a reviewer, though I must grant that it was never essential for the student, unless she were particularly diligent.

Had the two words “Plato and” been omitted from the title then one might have been inclined to welcome this book, and to affirm its usefulness for those embarking upon late antique philosophy. As things are, I am afraid that it may encourage those who are avid readers of Richard Sorabji’s Ancient Commentators on Aristotle series to market themselves too readily as experts on the whole of late antique philosophy, for to include Plato in the title and to fail to give the least idea of the extent of Platonic commentaries will only suggest that there is not much there to learn at all. As things are I doubt that any of us have yet learned enough about them. There would still be a slight problem even with restricting the title in this way, for the majority of the extant Aristotelian commentators would think of themselves as Platonists if anything, even if they did not write a word on Plato himself. Understanding the Platonist mind is much more of a challenge today than understanding Aristotle.

I readily agree that I could not write a satisfying book with a title such as this. However, if I had to do so then the first thing that I should have tackled is the philosophy of commentary itself. What does it imply about our theory of education or our epistemology that we undertake to educate people, ourselves among others, through the detailed examination of texts between 500 and 1000 years old? What is being assumed about the status of the texts themselves? Does it imply that the problems of philosophy themselves are already fixed? Does it imply that the ancients were closer to an understanding than for us, their successors? Or does it suggest that we can refine our answers to the perennial questions by returning again and again to philosophers, and writing the proverbial ‘footnotes’ on them? Finally, does it suggest that by drawing out what is buried deep within them we can draw out what is buried deep within ourselves? An affirmative answer to this last question might surely be indicative of Platonism, but a diagnosis of Platonism is probably not a death sentence.

Miira Tuominen’s book is not a book about the philosophy of commentating nor, as she freely admits, a book about a single philosophic system to which all commentators were committed. Rather it is a book about little bits of philosophy, derived from the constant study of selected Aristotelian texts. Measure it this way, and it becomes much better than when measured against its title.