The Anti-Romantic: Hegel Against Ironic Romanticism

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Jeffrey Reid, The Anti-Romantic: Hegel Against Ironic Romanticism, Bloomsbury, 2014, 196pp., $112.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781472574817.

Reviewed by Rocío Zambrana, University of Oregon


Jeffrey Reid's excellent book provides a compelling account of Hegel's system of science. What makes it compelling is the strategy he pursues throughout the book. Reid takes Hegel's critique of ironic romanticism as a heuristic device for specifying the status of Hegel's system. Reid does not offer a reconstruction of the system as a whole. Nor does he attempt to provide a comparison between Hegel and the Romantics (1). Reid discusses the three distinct types of romantic irony that Hegel identifies with Schlegel, Novalis, and Schleiermacher, and articulates Hegel's notions of system and objectivity in light of the specific threat that the three forms of ironic romanticism represent. These forms of romantic irony represent the three cultural phenomena -- the "three absolute presuppositions of our time," as Hegel puts it -- that Hegel sees as making up a world "determined as necessarily ironic," as Reid puts it (113). Skepticism, empiricism, and feeling are the main features of this ironic world, a world that denies the "objective content of Hegelian Science" (6, 113). Hegel's critique of ironic romanticism is crucial, then, since understanding why he sees it as a cultural and philosophical threat allows us to grasp the stakes of Hegel's system.

Three chapters, two intermezzos, a conclusion, and two codas comprise the book. The three chapte specify the character of each form of irony. The intermezzos develop further Hegel's response. The codas contextualize Hegel's engagement with Schlegel and Novalis, facilitating critical assessment of Hegel's claims (2). The opening chapter discusses Schlegel's ironic romanticism, which Hegel characterizes as a form of "sophistry, seduction, and vanity." This discussion allows Reid to elaborate the relation between discourse and objectivity in Hegel (10). The book's first intermezzo provides a full account of this relation, thereby intervening in debates about the status of language in Hegel's thought (52-64). The second chapter develops the form of irony Hegel attributes to Novalis, "pathological irony." This discussion allows Reid to situate irony within the system as both the figure of the beautiful soul and the individual in Sehnsucht (yearning). The second intermezzo builds on the first two chapters, discussing the first two forms of irony under the rubric of "barbarity" (Barbarei). Reid argues that barbarity is a term Hegel uses to describe the affirmation of the self at the expense of objectivity. The third chapter develops Schleiermacher's ironic romanticism as a "monstrous hybrid" of Schlegel and Novalis, one that combines Enlightenment empiricism with skeptical inwardness culminating in a "culture of self-feeling where the truth only appears in the form of self-certainty" (117).

Throughout the book, Reid provides insightful discussions of language and discourse, subjectivity and mental illness, barbarism and animality ("bestiality") in Hegel. The codas make the romantics appear in much more nuanced light than Hegel's account permits. These discussions should be of great interest to readers of Hegel. In what follows, however, I focus on Reid's treatment of Hegel's critique of ironic romanticism in order to assess Reid's understanding of Hegel's notions of system and objectivity. Indeed, I am here concerned with the view of Hegel's system that emerges. Reid rewrites key Hegelian terms in ways that I find fruitful, yet he does not carry through this rewriting to its fullest. In pointing out ambiguities in Reid's reworking of Hegel's notion of objectivity, specifically concerning Reid's understanding of discourse, I suggest interpretive options that exceed the intentions of the book. Rather than a logocentric or politically conservative picture of Hegel, the book delivers what with some caution we might call a materialist Hegel -- materialist in Marx's sense. Hegel's notion of objectivity refers to the "content" of the system laid out in the Encyclopedia, suggesting that the system is concerned with philosophical, scientific, and political discourses, practices, institutions. The system lays out objective truth insofar as it articulates the language of real, historically specific practices and institutions. My concerns have to do with Reid's privileging of language over the institutional character of discourse, which his reading of Hegel in effect develops.

Hegel's encounter with Schlegel is based on the latter's vanitization -- Reid's translation of Vereitelung -- of objectivity. Vanitization is a "flattening out," "depreciation," "evacuation" of objectivity, which Reid, quoting Hegel, glosses as "'the ethical content of rights, duties, and laws'" (13). The vanitization of objectivity is initially made possible by the link between sophistry and hypocrisy. Sophistry is the opinion of a particular subject. The individual "posit[s] itself in judgments (Urteile)," only to take its judgments, hypocritically, for an objective reality (14). Sophistry and hypocrisy reduce the world to an object of the will, then, "to the things of which it is the measure" (16). The relation to reality is one of "consumption." Consumption is tied to animality, leading to Hegel's biting critique of Schlegel's Lucinde. Romantic love and its objective expression in the bourgeois institution of marriage are reduced to mere seduction, to satisfaction of natural desire. Ignoring for a moment Hegel's conservative and indeed sexist conception of romantic love, the link between sophistry, hypocrisy, and seduction reveals the skeptical character of Schlegel's ironic romanticism. Vanitization is the skeptical consumption of a reality deemed a nullity. This nullification is not only exercised on the world, but also on the self. The ironic individual is therefore vain -- invested in self-satisfaction and self-enjoyment (41). However, although the ironic subject takes itself to be master, indeed "creator of all reality," it is but "emptied of all substantiality, all content" (47).

The first intermezzo is a rewriting of Hegelian logos as a response to the threat of Schlegelian irony. Schlegelian vanitization sunders "the holistic reality of the scientific word" (63). "Hegel's idea of science," Reid argues, "supposes a discourse that is not only objectively true but is also, itself, true objectivity" (52). The content of Hegel's system of science is the articulation of its content, which is to say, its objects (53). As a form of discursive articulation concerned with establishing the nature of logic, nature, and Geist, the system is not a mere presentation of truth or objectivity. It is its discursive articulation. Reid's example of the language of property is instructive. "The scientific meaning of property, its true objectivity, the fact that it can become a thing in the sense of a Sache," Reid writes, "is only manifest when it is transferred (sold and bought) from one will to another. This meaning manifests itself in the language of contract" (60). The objective meaning of property requires a real social space that gives not only meaning but material traction to the language of property, which expresses a mode of economic activity. Such objectivity, then, is an "expression of content within objective spirit: laws, constitutions, and even world history" (61). Schlegelian vanitization does not recognize the objectivity of the social space articulated as truth by "Hegelian Science" (philosophical reflection). It affirms its own judgments as the true.

While Reid's rewriting of Hegelian logos is incisive, his emphasis on language is in tension with the practical/institutional conception of discourse he develops. To be sure, Reid argues against the view that Hegel sees language as non-referential (52). It is a holistic system that articulates truth in and through real, material practices and institutions. Yet he nonetheless privileges linguistic articulation when discussing Hegel's understanding of truth. The tension is clear in his translation of Sache also as "word" (54) and in his defense of the syllogism as "grammatical analysis" of predication (58-59; see also 116). It is clearest, however, in his understanding of the difference between Inhalt and Gehalt in Hegel. Hegelian science is the "ultimate articulation of its objects/contents," since it articulates what is "essential to what it [the object] makes up" (53). Hegelian science makes possible the move from content as object to content as truth. This content is "essentially text," "meaningful discourse" (53). When specified, the discussion of discourse has an institutional character that in my view prohibits the reduction of truth to a matter of text, even Hegel's own.

Hegel's treatment of Novalis explores a different version of ironic romanticism as an expression of skeptical consumption. Novalis' pathological irony develops further the moment of self-consumption. Irony is no longer the "lack of seriousness of the judging subject who posits and destroys" (66). It is now a yearning, initially defined by the individual's relation to the external world. This individual, here the figure of the beautiful soul, denies action insofar as she deems it a "lowering" of her noble status (66). She thus turns away from the external world. And yet she "remains desire, a desire without an external object" (68). This turn inward is a turn against herself. Yearning, then, culminates in the individual's self-consumption in sickness and ultimately death. Reid develops Hegel's critique of pathological irony in light of Hegel's anthropological account of the soul whereby pathology is understood as a regression (81). The pathological condition of the ironic individual, here the figure of Gemüt, is not a mere physiological phenomenon, but a physical one. Reid's discussion of Hegel's account of mental illness in the Encyclopedia is instructive, especially the discussion of the notions of judgment and genius in this context (77-82). The upshot of the discussion, however, is the tension between Hegel's anthropological understanding of pathological irony and its systematic role. According to Reid, Hegel assigns an essential ambiguity to Novalis' romanticism. As the figure of the beautiful soul, romantic irony gains full expression in the system, yet its material conclusion lies in Novalis' own sickness and death (84).

The second intermezzo takes stock of the two forms of romantic irony in Schlegel and Novalis by understanding the former's vanitization of objectivity and the latter's "terminal skepticism" under the rubric of the term Barbarei. Reid argues that "barbarity" denotes the "unilateral manifestation of either the intuition or the understanding, to the extent that these one-sided expressions stand opposed to the organic and objective unity of (Hegelian) Science" (92). I am not sure that there is much to recover from Hegel's problematic link between "barbarous intuition" and the historical figure of Genghis Khan, and "barbarous understanding" and "savage Northern tribes" (92). Reid argues, however, that they intimate Hegel's use of Barbarei as the structure of mastery germane to Schlegel's and Novalis' versions of irony. Hegel's use of "barbarity" is better legitimized (if at all) by Reid's claim that Schiller's own use in his treatment of reason and nature probably inspired Hegel (92). The point of the discussion, however, is that the term Barbarei helps us see the way in which both forms of skepticism are also forms of empiricism. They are forms of empiricism given that they "impl[y] true objectivity's disintegration at the hands of the barbarous unilateral judgments of understanding, which, in turn, only recognizes finite phenomena as the adequate objects of knowledge" (95). More precisely, Reid argues, the term allows us to recognize the "reciprocal instability of empiricism and skepticism" (95). For Hegel, according to Reid, this instability is the consequence of the fact that both skepticism and empiricism are grounded in subjective feeling.

Schleiermacher's ironic romanticism represents a "monstrous hybrid" of Schlegel and Novalis. Hegel's engages Schleiermacher's account of the religious virtuoso and a community of religious feeling. Both the individual and the community are figures of particularity affirming their own objectivity. The religious community is a "reflection of a singular particularity" that generates nothing but a "'sea of sand' of monadic communities, each one possessing its singular 'point of view'" (104). Hegel's point is that, without religious doctrine and practice, the individual follows natural feeling. This destroys the "ethical consistency" of the individual, religion, and the state (108). Natural feeling is here linked with animality. In this context, animality represents the vanity and self-consumption of the two previous versions of irony. What is significant about Schleiermacher, Reid moves on to argue, is that "he appears as a 'contemporary representation'" of an ironic world (112). For Hegel, Reid points out, Schleiermacher's position is only possible because the other two forms of irony have already been accepted. Schleiermacher's ironic romanticism is thus an expression of a world committed to a subjective, fragmented conception of truth. It is a world essentially against the content of Hegelian science (113).

Reid argues that Hegel's treatment of Schleiermacher dispels the view that Hegel conceives of his own philosophy as the end of history "where absolute knowing is supposed to be already carried out in the world" (118). Hegel's system is, in fact, the response to an attack on objectivity -- on the authority of practices, discourses, and institutions of science, politics, religion, art, and so on. This is a strong argument for rejecting what was once the hegemonic understanding of Hegel. Reid's argument is a welcome addition to work that has already called into question political and metaphysical interpretations of the end of history thesis. Although Reid has gone a long way to motivate Hegel's investment in a system of science, he might have said more about the historicity of the practices, institutions, and discourses that are the content of that system. Is the content of Hegel's system -- the institutions of ethical life, for example -- Hegel's rebuttal to romantic irony? Or is it the form of the system -- the role of language in articulating the truth of real practices, institutions -- Hegel's rebuttal to ironic romanticism? If the content of the system is itself historically variable, then it is the form of the system and its understanding of content that can effectively confront the threat of romanticism.

A final note on one aspect of Reid's strategy is in order. Because he claims that the critique of ironic romanticism is a critique of an ironic world, Reid argues that the critiques of Schlegel, Novalis, and Schleiermacher take issue with the individuals, not merely their philosophical positions (see, e.g., 6, 10). Although it makes sense to see these three figures as exemplary of an ironic world by taking their work as expressions of three forms of irony, I am not convinced that Hegel grounds his critique of romanticism on these individuals. While Hegel's polemics might provide textual support for Reid's claim, the argument against romanticism gains traction in light of the position that their work expresses.

While I disagree with some of the claims the book makes, I recommend it without reservation. It is engaging, fresh, and insightful. It captures the spirit of Hegel's idealism, remarkably, on two registers. It contextualizes essential features that we might want to reclaim. It also makes clear aspects of Hegel's corpus that we might need to reject. The book opens paths of interpretation beyond itself, and that is a core component of an excellent book.