The Architecture of the Imagination: New Essays on Pretence, Possibility, and Fiction

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Shaun Nichols (ed.), The Architecture of the Imagination: New Essays on Pretence, Possibility, and Fiction, Oxford University Press, 2006, 296pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 0199275734.

Reviewed by Stacie Friend, Birkbeck, University of London


If there are things that are genuinely impossible to imagine, does this tell us anything about genuine possibility? Why is it harder to imagine that female infanticide is morally virtuous than to imagine that a banana is a telephone or that a sea sponge is a walking, talking fry cook? How can we desire that Cordelia live without wanting King Lear to be changed, or be sad at her demise when we know she does not exist? The contributions to this excellent collection address such questions by exploring the nature and limits of the propositional imagination, the capacity exploited in imagining that something is the case. As Shaun Nichols notes in his useful introduction, the last two decades have seen the flourishing of cognitive accounts of the propositional imagination, most of them developed to explicate the mechanisms underlying pretend play or the capacity to understand other people's mental states ('mindreading'). While the simulation theory/theory-theory debate over mindreading informs several of the chapters, The Architecture of the Imagination expands the discussion of imagination beyond the confines of this debate. It is the only collection on imagination that covers such a wide variety of issues, and is thus essential reading for anyone interested in the topic. The essays provide a valuable overview of current work on the propositional imagination and insight into its potential philosophical significance. They also indicate the ways in which philosophical, psychological, and neuroscientific considerations can illuminate each other.

One of the questions prompted by this mix of considerations is the appropriate role of empirical evidence in addressing philosophical puzzles. I focus on this question with respect to two issues covered in the volume: emotional responses to fiction and imaginative resistance. I begin, however, with an overview of themes and topics. For those essays I do not discuss in more detail, these brief descriptions must suffice as my recommendation.

The four papers in the first section of the volume explore the nature of the imagination. Timothy Schroeder and Carl Matheson offer neuroscientific evidence supporting the widespread assumption that imagining can be causally responsible for affective responses. Alvin Goldman defends a simulationist account of our emotional engagement with fiction, on which readers create a "rough facsimile" of mental states in their minds, for instance by adopting the point of view of a hypothetical reader or observer of fact. Adam Morton considers the ways in which we may mis-imagine someone's states of mind, arguing that we are likely to be most accurate when representing what another person imagines. Deena Skolnick and Paul Bloom consider the implications of evidence that children, like adults, not only distinguish the real from the fictional, they also keep track of what counts as "real" or "make-believe" within different fictional worlds.

In the first of two chapters on pretence, Peter Carruthers argues that children are motivated to engage in pretend play when their imaginings provoke positive emotional reactions, which in turn generate desires to act out those imaginings. Gregory Currie defends a pretence theory of irony against various objections and argues that its main rival, the echoic theory, must also invoke pretence.

In his contribution, Kendall Walton disentangles the variety of puzzles that have been associated with imaginative resistance -- the topic of the third section of the volume -- arguing that the greatest challenge is to account for our resistance to accepting certain authorial claims as establishing what is fictionally the case. Tamar Gendler, refining an account she has offered elsewhere,[1] argues that we resist imagining morally deviant claims in fiction primarily because we take the author to be inviting us simultaneously to believe a corresponding claim about the real world. Jonathan Weinberg and Aaron Meskin develop a cognitive architecture designed to resolve puzzles about fiction and emotion, imaginative resistance, and the imagination/supposition distinction, arguing that this more scientific approach is superior to standard philosophical accounts.

In the paper opening the final section on imagination and modality, Christopher Hill argues that we cannot infer from our ability to conceive a scenario that it is metaphysically possible -- an objection to standard arguments for property dualism -- and goes on to offer a positive proposal about how knowledge of metaphysical possibility might be attained. Shaun Nichols argues from evidence of children's modal locutions that the primary function of modal judgment is to represent risks and opportunities, and that a naturalist account of imagination explains why we have the intuitions about "absolute impossibility" that we do. In the final chapter of the collection, Ray Sorensen argues that those who maintain that conceivability entails possibility are thereby committed to the less plausible "meta-entailment thesis" -- that if it is conceivable that it is conceivable that p, then p is possible -- and shows that a wide range of philosophical arguments in fact depend on this thesis.

I turn now to the topic of fiction and emotion. Recent discussions of the paradox of fiction -- the puzzle of explaining how we can have (rational) emotional responses to merely imagined characters and events -- have been marked by an increased attention to psychological and neuroscientific approaches to the emotions. While this is a positive development, the philosophical problem is not resolved solely by appeal to empirical findings. For instance, the evidence offered by Schroeder and Matheson (S&M) rules out some theories of the relationship between imagining and emotion, but does not determine a single interpretation of this relationship. S&M agree with the widespread assumption that imagining constitutes a "Distinct Cognitive Attitude" (DCA), an attitude similar to belief in some ways but not others, which is responsible for causing affective responses; but they point out that this assumption lacks direct empirical support. They therefore present neuroscientific evidence tracing a clear causal pathway from imaginative stimulus to DCA (consisting in unimodal or multimodal representations) to felt response. This result is philosophically important because it excludes views according to which affect is produced not by imaginings but by associated beliefs, for instance about what is fictional or possible. Yet as S&M make clear, the evidence is compatible with several other competing approaches to emotion and imagination.

In particular, the fact that imagined and believed stimuli produce the same neural consequences, thus causing the same kinds of felt responses, does not by itself refute the contention that our affective engagement with imagined characters should be distinguished from the full-fledged emotions generated by beliefs: that there is a difference, for example, between genuine fear and quasi fear (to use Kendall Walton's familiar terminology). It is common currency between Walton and his critics that we have emotional experiences as a result of engaging with fictions; the dispute is about how to interpret these experiences in a philosophically illuminating way. For this reason I am skeptical of the claim by Weinberg and Meskin that once we reject the folk-psychological assumption that emotions require beliefs and accept that imaginings can produce affective responses, "the puzzle of emotions and fiction is dissolved" (180). This is so only if we take the puzzle to be exhausted by the causal question of how affect can be produced by anything other than belief; but answering this question does nothing to address the philosophical issues about intentionality and rationality provoked by our emotional engagement with fiction.  It is hard to see how empirical results could settle such questions.

I am equally skeptical of Goldman's claim that psychological studies of narrative comprehension support a simulationist account of our emotional engagement with fiction over the rival "single code" theory proposed by Shaun Nichols and Stephen Stich[2] (more accurate versions of which are ably defended by Carruthers, Weinberg and Meskin, and Nichols in their contributions). The view that we simulate the mental states of characters has been subject to extensive criticism, since our affective responses are often distinct from those of the characters: our compassion for Anna Karenina is not a simulation of any emotion she feels. Goldman replies to this objection in two ways. First, he suggests that consumers of fiction usually simulate a hypothetical reader or observer of fact, proposing, for example, that in watching a fictional film we take ourselves to be "seeing an unfolding scenario from the camera's perspective" (50). I find this proposal implausible as an account of our experience of fiction in general (or cinematic experience in particular), but for present purposes I will leave these worries aside. Goldman's second reply is to adduce psychological research indicating that readers track the perspective of narrative protagonists and appraise events from their point of view, which "supports the idea that character simulation is a common form of mental engagement with fiction" (51). For instance, Goldman cites studies in which subjects processed sentences mentioning an object associated with the protagonist (e.g., a bag she carries) more quickly than a dissociated object (e.g., the bag after being put down); and studies in which they processed sentences matching a protagonist's likely emotional state more quickly than sentences not matching it.

These results (and many others) support the hypothesis that readers keep track of information relevant from the perspective of the protagonist, presumably because it is important to understand the story. But they do not show that readers adopt that perspective in the stronger sense of simulating the character. There is no reason to expect that readers who inferred a character's emotional state by deploying a theory about how people in similar situations are likely to feel would be any slower in processing the relevant sentences than readers who made the inference by running an "off-line" simulation to discover how they would feel in a similar situation. That readers infer characters' emotional states is a datum; it does not tell us how readers manage the task.

The three chapters on imaginative resistance provide a good sense of how philosophical tools and empirical methods can contribute in complementary ways to our understanding of the imagination. In his wide-ranging and thoughtful contribution, Walton distinguishes among the various problems associated with "the puzzle of imaginative resistance (so-called)." The aesthetic puzzle is about the relation between aesthetic and moral values. The fictionality puzzle arises when we refuse to accept that an authorial statement is fictional, i.e., that it is supposed to be imagined. And there are two imaginative puzzles, one concerning our inability to imagine something, the other concerning our unwillingness. (This list follows the division proposed elsewhere by Brian Weatherson,[3] but Walton's discussion differs in various respects.) While the aesthetic puzzle touches on psychological phenomena -- as when we take a morally deviant outlook to diminish a work's aesthetic value because we cannot imaginatively adopt that perspective -- it is essentially a normative question not amenable to empirical answer. Similarly, although Walton sometimes describes the fictionality puzzle in terms of an "imaginative inability" (145), the question is why we rightly refuse to recognize certain claims as fictionally the case (why there is a breakdown in "authorial authority," as Weatherson puts it). This is also a normative question, and Walton argues that it is the most philosophically challenging. Although I suspect that the fictionality and aesthetic puzzles are more closely related to the imaginative puzzles than Walton appears to think, this is no reason to ignore the distinctions.

Gendler's contribution focuses on the imaginative puzzles. Acknowledging critics who have claimed that imaginative resistance to morally deviant claims in fiction involves not just unwillingness but also inability (or comparative difficulty), Gendler now claims that such cases "evoke both feelings of imaginative impropriety and imaginative barriers, but … it is the imaginative impropriety that explains our failure to imagine the [deviant] world" (156). This is not to say that we always experience resistance to claims that are problematic, morally or otherwise; Gendler gives detailed consideration to the ways in which fictions can provoke or inhibit the experience of "pop-out" associated with imaginative resistance. Gendler's discussion clarifies a complex set of issues and (I believe) offers a persuasive defense of her position. She is surely correct, for example, that the troubling Problem of Nursery School Nomenclature -- the puzzle "of explaining why so many nursery schools have a Bumblebee Room, but no nursery schools have a Dung Beetle room, given that (in some reasonable sense of harder) it's no harder to imagine your child as a dung beetle than as a bumblebee" -- reflects an unwillingness rather than an inability to imagine in a certain way (151). This unwillingness can be explained, Gendler says, by the results of social-psychological research showing that mental representations (such as images of dung beetles) automatically trigger associated perception and action dispositions; presumably, these are dispositions we would not wish to have toward our children. The parallel with the moral cases is insightful.

Weinberg and Meskin claim that Gendler's (original) proposal is nonetheless limited by its restriction to folk-psychological intuitions about the conditions under which imaginative impropriety occurs. They are also critical of accounts that invoke metaphysical notions, such as Weatherson's argument that imaginative obstacles arise when we are supposed to imagine some higher-level claim but are forbidden to imagine any lower-level facts that would make the higher-level claim true. W&M provide good reasons to think that these and other accounts in the philosophical literature cannot offer a completely general solution to the imaginative puzzle. Their proposal is thus to "break out of the restriction to folk and philosophical resources" and adopt a more scientific approach (176). On their view, the source of imaginative obstacles is a conflict between pieces of the cognitive architecture. For instance, if a fiction instructs us to imagine both P and not-P, inference mechanisms automatically detect the contradiction and try to remove one or both of the contradictory propositions from the "imagination box" (IB), just as they would from the "belief box" (BB). (Here W&M adopt the conventional "boxological" means of distinguishing the functional roles of imaginings and beliefs.) In other cases we experience a block due to a conflict between the inputs of two components of the architecture, as when we are instructed to imagine P (e.g., 'murder of innocents is morally obligatory') by a fiction, but our moral judgment system places not-P into the IB. W&M make a compelling case that whatever causes our experiences of imaginative obstacles, there is no reason to think that it will be entirely accessible to introspection or intuition. Furthermore, they offer a plausible and unified account of the psychological mechanisms generating the experience of imaginative blocks consistent with a range of empirical research.

There is an obvious worry about W&M's proposal as so far described, however: the fact that we often have no trouble imagining offensive, impossible, and even contradictory fictions. Why, for example, are only some contradictory representations "kicked out" of the IB by the inference mechanisms? W&M answer that authors may show us "some trick, some means of redirecting our attention, that can prevent the automatic systems from doing their usual job," as when science fictions "hide their time-travel paradoxes behind an ink cloud of uninterpreted techno-sounding gobbledygook" (190). While this reply is certainly correct, it does not seem to be of a piece with the rest of W&M's proposal; they offer no account of the psychological mechanisms involved in imagining along with paradoxical stories (though they acknowledge the need for such an account). I suggest that their invocation of authorial devices highlights the way in which a purely psychological approach is incomplete. We want to understand not only the psychological mechanisms underpinning the experience of imaginative obstacles, but also the no doubt multifarious features of fictional works (or other prompts to imagining) that provoke or inhibit that experience. In my view, an account of such features is also important in addressing the aesthetic and fictionality puzzles. So there is plenty of room here for both philosophical analysis and empirical research.

In these comments I have highlighted just a few of the ways in which empirical evidence both can, and cannot, contribute to the resolution of philosophical puzzles about the imagination. There can be little doubt that theories of the nature, limits, and role of the imagination should take into account results in psychology and neuroscience; nor that the import of these results requires interpretation in light of broader theoretical concerns. This collection demonstrates the way in which essays that are both empirically informed and philosophically sophisticated can greatly improve our understanding of the imagination.



[1] In "The Puzzle of Imaginative Resistance," Journal of Philosophy 97 (2000): 55-81.

[2] In Mindreading, Oxford University Press, 2003.

[3] In "Morality, Fiction, and Possibility," Philosophers' Imprint 4 (2004): 1-27.