The Art of Theater

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James R. Hamilton, The Art of Theater, Blackwell Publishing, 2007, 226pp., $79.95 (hbk), ISBN 9781405113533.

Reviewed by Brian Soucek, University of Chicago


James R. Hamilton writes that his book, The Art of Theater, has but one concern: to explain and defend the claim that theatrical performance is "a form of art in its own right, independent of literature" (15). This claim, he adds, has always been true; theatrical performances have never been mere presentations of texts. Its truth has only recently been discovered, however, as the history of theater long hid it from our view.

This discovery has occasioned a book that has virtues worth recommending, though it is not entirely clear to whom. With little context-setting and often difficult writing, the book would be a struggle for undergraduates. (The Art of Theater is concerned with arguing a thesis, not giving an overview of its field.) Specialists already familiar with the field, those versed in competing accounts of the ontology of theater and related arts, will likely wonder why there is not more engagement with such accounts. Given that the book's glossary offers explanations of terms like "necessary and sufficient conditions," the book is perhaps aimed largely at an audience beyond philosophy. This audience might, in turn, care less about meta-ontological questions which Hamilton neglects, but which struck me as crucial (in ways described below) to the success of his central claim.

This claim itself lies somewhere between the provocative and the radically revisionary. On the one, more revisionary, hand is Hamilton's insistence that his thesis was true even when widely unacknowledged -- say, by the "dominant tradition of theater in Western culture at least since the late 1700s" (199). This suggests that the beliefs of those theater-goers who have long viewed theatrical performances as "performances of something else, usually works of literary art" (199) need thorough revision. On the other hand, Hamilton also claims that "spectators have always demonstrated [the truth of his thesis] by practices of reception" (16). Hamilton's project thus seems aimed at bringing our theoretical beliefs about theater's ontology in line with some of our theater-going practices.

The practices Hamilton emphasizes are common claims about plays we have seen. As Hamilton points out, this last phrase really means performances we have seen. We speak of characters in plays, but "we are usually thinking of them as we saw them in this or that performance or set of performances" (xi). Hamilton's "we" here may appear tenuous, but it is somewhat bolstered by the quick history of theater that opens the book. Racing (in fourteen dizzying pages) through the naturalists, Brecht, Artaud, Grotowski, Theater of the Absurd, and avant-garde productions by the likes of Herbert Blau and JoAnne Akalaitis, Hamilton invokes an art world in which the work of performers and directors is privileged over that of writers. In this company, Hamilton's "we" becomes more plausible. One of the strengths of this book, in fact, is its grounding in, and comfort with, recent and avant-garde theater. These are the practices which Hamilton clearly wants his ontology to fit. A possible (though unacknowledged) inspiration here is Arthur Danto, whose well-known Hegelian story traces art history, as Hamilton traces theater history, to an avant-garde moment in the 1960s, after which philosophy was able, finally, to say what art essentially is (and hence always was).[1]

After this history, Hamilton explains what it means for theatrical performances to be works of art independent of texts. Hamilton dismisses three competing accounts of the text-performance relationship: 1) that which treats performances as interpretations of works of dramatic literature, 2) a two-text model in which performances are treated as "texts" which are translations or transformations of a literary text, and 3) a type-token model in which performances and texts are tokens of some play-type (23-31). In place of these, Hamilton suggests an "ingredients model" in which a text is not a recipe but rather an ingredient to be used (or not) in the making of a performance. On this model, a performance is "never a performance of some other work"; it is an artwork in its own right (31-2). A textual "ingredient" might have "another life as a work of literary art", but whether it does or does not is logically unrelated to the status of the performance (200). Finally, according to the "ingredients model", performance identity is established not in relation to any text, but solely by facts about performances themselves.

This last claim requires three chapters of explanation -- all of Part II. Hamilton's aim is to show how "audiences can identify performances without reference to texts" (73). To do so, he develops an account of "basic theatrical understanding" of what goes on in a performance. Such understanding need not be demonstrated discursively; audiences might react physically in the proper ways as the performance unfolds. Hamilton then shows how audience members converge on which characteristics of the performance are salient. Finally, he shows how these characteristics allow audiences to identify characters, events, and objects in and across performances. After a good deal of analysis, Hamilton's conclusion is that we recognize things in the theater much the same way that we recognize them in the world; we just do it in a theater.

Part II having shown how performances can be independently identified as works, Part III contains an account of how these works can be seen as works of art. Hamilton's guiding intuition is that, as art, a performance must be appreciable as an achievement, and this requires knowledge of certain relevant backgrounds. In particular, Hamilton analyzes the deeper object- and performer-understanding which one gains through a comparative knowledge of other performances' structures and an awareness of the performance traditions in (or against) which performers are working. (Much of the text is devoted to defining these and similar terms, all of which appear again in a helpful glossary at the book's end.) Full appreciation requires one to link these two understandings by realizing "how the performance practices contribute to or detract from the performed object and … whether the performed object is achievable by certain kinds of performance practices rather than others" (217). Here Hamilton draws on Richard Wollheim's idea of criticism as retrieval: appreciating a performance involves a "reconstruction of the creative process" (181).[2]

Hamilton notes that in his book "ontological questions are set aside or avoided, as studiously as possible, in favor of epistemological questions" (220). Indeed, the bulk of his study aims to give accounts of how audiences can know and agree upon the salient features of performances, how performers' intentions are to be discovered and treated, how theatrical styles, conventions, and traditions come about, and so on. Hamilton's discussion of these topics is detailed and persuasive, and it draws upon a wide range of philosophical work. (Hamilton's book has far more to say about David Lewis's views on convention and Gareth Evans's work on reference than, say, Aristotle's or Nietzsche's views on drama.) Still, I fear that ontology has been set aside a little too quickly. Consider, for example, the strategy stated at the outset of Part II: "To show that theatrical performance is independent of literature, and always has been … we need to explain how it is that audiences can identify performances without reference to texts" (73). It is certainly true that Hamilton's central thesis -- the ontological claim that theatrical performances are artworks independent of texts -- requires that audiences be able to identify performances without referencing texts; the epistemological argument is necessary for his thesis. Yet it is hardly sufficient. Hamilton's conclusion, at the end of Part II -- that "audiences do not, nor need they, appeal to texts to secure identification of theatrical performances. And, so, theatrical performance is a practice independent of literature" (129) -- slides, characteristically, between "need not" to "do not". I worry that Hamilton does more to show the former than the latter. That is to say, Hamilton's ingredients model may be plausible, but that alone does not make it preferable to the three other models so quickly discarded in Part I. It certainly does not show that the ingredients model is and always has been true.

This raises the larger question: what does it mean to say that an ontological theory of theatrical performance is true? What considerations might lead one to side with Hamilton's ingredients model over its competitors? One model might better describe our practices, of course. But given that Hamilton talks of his ingredients model as a "discovery" (15), a truth unrealized for decades, if not centuries, of theatrical practice, it is unclear how this could be his criterion. My point is not that the ingredients model is wrong. I just wish Hamilton had spent some time explaining what it means to say that it is right. Exciting work has recently been done on this topic, as philosophers of art have become increasingly self-conscious about how their ontological questions might be decided and how revisionary a good ontology of art may be.[3]

Much of this work has centered on musical ontology, a particularly lively field in contemporary philosophy of art.[4] Yet this too is largely absent in The Art of Theater. Given the exhaustive discussions of the type/token model in the philosophy of music, Hamilton might have been able to consider more nuanced versions of his ingredients model's chief competitor. Discussing the literature on musical ontology would not only have helped avoid straw men in Part I; more importantly, it would have allowed Hamilton to show how his questions about theater relate to -- or differ from -- questions often asked about musical works. There seem, at least at first glance, to be strong analogies between music and theater: both are temporal arts that involve performances and, at least in certain traditions, scores or scripts. Hamilton himself invokes the analogy several times (cf. 34, 51, 81, 208). One wonders, then, whether Hamilton's theory should apply equally to music as well as theater. Is there any reason why the truth Hamilton claims to have discovered about the independence of theatrical performance is not equally a truth about musical performance -- or, to use Hamilton's other occasional examples, dance performances or gymnastic routines? This is to ask, as Hamilton does not, what makes the philosophy of theater a distinct field of study, with issues separate from those of the other performative arts.

Even as I wondered this, however, I also found myself asking the opposite question: not whether the philosophy of theater has too narrow a scope, but whether it might be too broad. The philosophy of art, once a monolithic field, has in recent years been fracturing into philosophies of arts -- of painting, music, literature, etc.[5] It is unclear how far this trend might go. Once again, the philosophy of music is instructive. It has been suggested there, for example, that rock, jazz, and classical music each might require different work concepts.[6] So although I asked above whether an ontology of theater should prove any different from an ontology of music or dance, we might instead wonder whether a field that ranges from the Commedia dell'Arte to Hedda Gabbler, from Hamlet at the Globe Theater to Kraken's Elsinore itself requires a more fine-grained ontology. Just as philosophies of jazz and rock should perhaps supplant the philosophy of music, perhaps we don't need a philosophy of theater tout court, but rather philosophies of scripted versus non-scripted theater.

These questions are particularly relevant since Hamilton uses avant-garde theater as a counterexample to traditional text-based ontologies, thereby assuming that one overarching theory should apply, as it were, both downtown and on Broadway. The admirably inclusive theory which Hamilton produces holds that text-based tradition in theater is just one among others. This seems quite right. But Hamilton means by this not that there is one tradition that is genuinely text-based and another that is performance-based (i.e., logically independent of texts). Instead, he asserts the truth of the performance-based theory and applies it even to the tradition which thinks of itself -- wrongly, he says -- as text-based. Performers in the latter tradition, Hamilton writes, "have chosen to constrain their choices as though certain false views were true" (210). Once again, a meta-ontological question emerges. Had theater really been working under the illusion of a false ontology all those centuries, or did its practices -- and thus its ontology -- simply change at some point? Hamilton does not consider the latter possibility.

That said, Hamilton's description of a theatrical tradition that constrains itself by false views treated as if they were true is, in my view, one of the most provocative and fascinating ideas of the book. The claim is that theater in the West has been, and largely still is, dominated by a supreme fiction, an illusory, self-imposed ontological straightjacket. Philosophy's longstanding concerns with issues of fidelity or authenticity in performance are the by-products, and Hamilton's theory efficiently sets them aside. On his view, fidelity to texts is an ideal some performers (or traditions) might freely adopt -- or they might not. We can evaluate this choice as one among many in the making of a performance.

I find this idea appealing, and I agree with Hamilton that it is wrong to think that theater itself consists in the faithful performances of texts. But this doesn't mean that traditional theater did not involve the performance of texts. In other words, traditional theater wasn't necessarily wrong about the ontology of its works; it was wrong in thinking that ontology necessary. Its error was in making its ontology prescriptive rather than descriptive, in naturalizing it and treating it as universal. Though Hamilton's philosophy of theater, happily, isn't trying to preclude or proscribe any types of performance, his belief in an ontological truth, hidden and awaiting discovery, strikes me as similarly wrongheaded. Of course, I might be wrong about this. Whether I am or not, however, is the kind of broader question which The Art of Theater, for all its exacting definitions, never asks.

[1] Arthur C. Danto, After the End of Art: Contemporary Art and the Pale of History (Princeton University Press, 1997). Hamilton does not make any Hegelian claims about the "end of art", though he does talk of a history which finally reveals the true nature of theatrical performance (15).

[2] As Hamilton notes, the phrase comes from Wollheim's "Criticism as Retrieval," in Art and Its Objects, 2nd edition with six supplementary essays (Cambridge University Press, 1980), 185-204.

[3] See Amie L. Thomasson, "Debates about the Ontology of Art: What are We Doing Here?" Philosophy Compass 1/3 (2006): 245-255, and "The Ontology of Art and Knowledge in Aesthetics," Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism 63:3 (Summer 2005): 221-229 for an excellent discussion of the limits on revisionary ontologies.

[4] The work of Nelson Goodman, Peter Kivy, Jerrold Levinson, Stephen Davies, and many others have given the field its liveliness. Meanwhile, influential critiques of musical ontology have come from Lydia Goehr, The Imaginary Museum of Musical Works (Oxford University Press, 1992) and Aaron Ridley, "Against Musical Ontology," Journal of Philosophy 100 (2003): 203-220.

[5] See Peter Kivy, Philosophies of Arts: An Essay in Differences (Cambridge University Press, 1997).

[6] Andrew Kania addresses this in "Piece for the End of Time: In Defense of Musical Ontology," British Journal of Aesthetics 48:1 (January 2008): 65-79, 76. Stephen Davies discusses the issue at length in Musical Works and Performances: A Philosophical Exploration (Oxford University Press, 2001).