The Beautiful, the True and the Good: Studies in the History of Thought

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Robert E. Wood, The Beautiful, the True and the Good: Studies in the History of Thought, Catholic University of America Press, 2015, 474pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780813227474.

Reviewed by Daniel Dwyer, Xavier University


In this book, Robert E. Wood has collected 22 articles published over more than four decades. He includes a preface and an introductory chapter that address how the essays intersect thematically. Given the vast amount of historically informed philosophical terrain he covers, I can only do justice to the book by picking out certain major themes present in almost all of the essays. Although Wood's cast of characters is impressively vast, starting from the Presocratics up through the late Heidegger, his interest is not primarily directed toward the historical interpretation of what these Western philosophers used to think, but rather toward how they speak to the contemporary human condition and "the things themselves." It is thus an attempt at a fusion of philosophical horizons. He argues that philosophy is a matter of critical and systematic claims about the whole (xxi). By philosophia he means "the enduring quest for the manifestness of the Whole to which we are directed by the ever-manifest but usually only implicitly given character of our own immanent structure" (31). Wood maintains that he studies how each thinker is both critical of and assimilates the thought of what precedes him, but that he does so "not to perform some antiquarian scholarly exercise but to come into an essential relation to the matters considered" (108). I will reflect on this particular hermeneutic at the end of the essay.

I will lay out what I take to be four key themes addressed by Wood in almost all of the articles in this rich and satisfying collection: 1) the descriptive-phenomenological method employed throughout the essays, 2) a primarily anthropological approach to human beings' orientation to what he refers to alternately as the whole, the totality, and plenitude of Being, 3) the centrality of the heart as the originary locus of the erotic tendency to confront the whole of Being, and 4) the pervasive interpretation of the late Heidegger's notion of meditative or indwelling thinking. I will end by reflecting on the value of Wood's reading of the history of certain philosophers as a textual approach to perennial themes in philosophy (indeed, there are very few secondary works cited, which, given Wood's goals, is perhaps a virtue of the collection).

First, Wood's method is to explicate the sense of classic texts in the Western philosophical canon in the spirit of what he calls a descriptive phenomenology, which articulates "how things present themselves in the field of experience" (xi). As Wood puts it, "The basic structure of this field calls for the interpretation of what is described directly, especially as present in the texts of the philosophic tradition. That same structure orients us beyond current understanding and calls for dialogue" (ibid.). Descriptive phenomenology is not necessarily a contrastive term here. Indeed, the only article in which he goes into detail about a specifically transcendental phenomenology is entitled "The Phenomenologists," and even there his preferred vision of phenomenology focuses mostly on intentionality and the existential phenomenology of the late Heidegger. Wood thus uses descriptive phenomenology largely as a term of art that commits him to no particular school of thought -- exegesis is not theory-laden for Wood. He calls Plato a "proto-phenomenologist" (21) because he "provides a fundamental phenomenological inventory of the basic framework of the field of experience" (30). Evidently, for Wood, what makes phenomenology in his sense descriptive is its focus on the eidetic features of human experience: "it is the presence of the eidetic that allows us to move from sensory gawking and emoting to understanding" (133). Put thus, almost all of the thinkers he discusses in the book are contributing to a project of descriptive phenomenology, despite their differences.

The second major theme discernible in the collection concerns human nature's orientation to the whole. There is a pervasive bipolarity to be noted in his philosophers' thought concerning the constitution of the human being. On the one hand, there are the biologically grounded, animalistic and genetic components that confront the sensory world, and, on the other, there is our peculiar humanness that is "ontologically referred, via the notion of Being, to the whole of what is" (xx). For Wood, "Human nature has a double ground. On the one hand, there is the obvious biological ground . . . On the other hand, there is, less obvious, what I call the ontological ground" (446). In Heideggerian fashion, the human being is the locus of the question of Being. Far from being a rigid intellectualist, Wood argues that despite the gap -- or empty space of meaning -- between the sensory and the totality, "the meaning of the Whole . . . [is] the object of our deepest human desire" (xxiv). In Platonic fashion we are oriented toward a totality that we do not and cannot possess. In an essay on Buber and Marcel, Wood makes this point a bit clearer when he says the question of wholeness regards both the wholeness of one's own being and one's relation to the wholeness of what is. What is necessary "is a return to a lived sense of the Whole itself from the abstract delineation of the encompassing framework of all our dealings in relation to that Whole" (418). Clearly, for Wood, there is a non-discursive orientation to and contemplative beholding of the Good, where we dwell in the Good and not simply think, speak, and argue about it.

Wood's third main theme is what could be characterized as an erotic anthropology of the heart. According to him, "Heart and the limits of its desire initiate Western metaphysics. Not thought, not logic or reason, but 'the heart' with its desire is first" (13). The heart is the locus of one's  biological givens and spontaneous preferences, choices and thoughts. More specifically, Wood contrasts "the Me, . . . the sum total of genetic, cultural, and historical-personal determinations concretely making me, Me . . . [and that] dimension of Me that points beyond everything objectifiable to the Plenitude" (161). The Platonic resonances are hard to overlook: "eros is the ground of the soul . . . [and] seeks identity with the undying Whole. As an object of eros, the Whole is manifest in its beauty" (38). Wood is therefore no Cartesian intellectualist. As he writes, the "heart is the medium between the too-often dichotomized literalism of a mechanized body and a logicized reason" (14). The heart is thus the locus of "our reference to everything and to everything about everything. It thus has an erotic structure in the Platonic sense: it is an oriented emptiness, an emptiness aimed at plenitude" (275). Wood compares Plato's Good to Heidegger's Being, in that the latter "is correlative not to intellect but to the emotional attunement that Plato designates as Eros" (144).

Fourthly, Wood focuses on the indwelling meditative thought (das besinnliche Nachdenken) described in the writings of the late Heidegger. One of the key distinctions present in many of the essays is that between representative-calculative thinking and meditative thinking. Correlative to this distinction is that between the orthotic level of truth (conceptual, discursive formation) and the alethic level of truth. Whereas orthotic thinking "constructs and is ultimately governed by the will-to-power," meditative thinking "lets beings be" (138). Wood's gloss on alethe doxa is "'manifest appearance', direct insight into universal relations" (25). Here one notes again Wood's descriptive-phenomenological approach, which he locates in most of the thinkers he discusses, as an eidetic insight into universal characteristics of human experience and the beauty, truth, and goodness in Being. What is evident in Wood's readings of the history of philosophy is the insistence on the emptiness of the notion of being without a correlative reading of the anthropological nature of the human heart's desire for and meditative thought about aspects of the Whole of Being. In this sense, we could interpret Wood's attempts to get at the core of the continuing dialogue between and among the great Western philosophers as an investigation of the intentionality or directedness of human nature beyond itself toward the plenitude of Being. In this respect, Wood waxes eloquently on the Heideggerian theme: "One can come away from beings with their data and laws: such favors can be seized: beings can be raped. But their being, their presence, must be left be, reverently, before their real secret is revealed" (178).

Wood's collection is a serious endeavor to take the history of thought as a continual dialogue across generations among philosophers who are addressing sufficiently similar topics, both anthropological and ontological. It does indeed appear in many of the essays as if the anthropology were driving the ontology. And yet there is almost always a meditation on the mutual interpenetration of both directions of inquiry. The main thesis of most of the articles could be summarized by saying that the whole or totality toward which the human being is oriented or referred is quite often recalcitrant to full disclosure, but that fact in no way eradicates the human desire for a certain conception of the fullness of being.

The book as a whole does not attempt to establish a hermeneutic that would justify that these thinkers are all aiming at the same project or at "the things themselves." In this light, one might get the impression that this is Wood's cumulative effort to arrive at Woodian themes by organizing the material such that the anthropological and ontological themes become manifest in highly selective readings. Yet he does speak of aspiring to a Gadamerian fusion of horizons, and his readings do get at points of serious overlap, which span ancient, medieval, and contemporary thought. In sum, Wood is calling his readers to re-engage with the whole of the history of Western philosophical thought, seeking continuity of themes without overlooking discontinuity of emphases. In clear prose, acute insights, and a thorough grasp of a wide diversity of thinkers, Wood presents to historians of philosophy a master's synoptic view of how it all (might) make sense.