The Blackwell Guide to Descartes' Meditations

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Stephen Gaukroger (ed.), The Blackwell Guide to Descartes' Meditations, Blackwell Publishing, 2006, 288 pp, $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 140521875X.

Reviewed by Dan Kaufman, University of Colorado at Boulder


Descartes' Meditations on First Philosophy is the philosophical event of the seventeenth century and perhaps any century. It is a presentation of the mature philosophical thought of the most important philosopher of the century, and if that weren't enough, it includes objections from several other major philosophers, such as Hobbes, Arnauld, and Gassendi, along with Descartes' replies to their objections. By my lights, nothing like this happened either before or since 1641. Thus, it is fitting that such a great work has a companion like The Blackwell Guide to Descartes' Meditations. In recent years, there has been a rash of accessible yet respectable 'introductions' and 'guides' to great philosophers and great philosophical works. And there are even more on the way! To an outsider, the number of these books would seem a bit pointless. However, until they cease generally being of high quality, I see no good reason not to keep them coming. The Blackwell Guide to Descartes' Meditations (henceforth 'Guide') is an exceptionally good addition to these sorts of books. Stephen Gaukroger has put together twelve excellent essays on the central topics in the Meditations, written by some of the most important scholars working on Descartes and early modern philosophy. While I would like to give each of the essays the attention and critical evaluation they deserve, due to space limitations, brief summaries must suffice:

The Guide opens with Roger Ariew's informative and scholarly essay on the Objections and Replies and the role that the Objections played in shaping Descartes' thought.

The Meditations is primarily known as a work in epistemology, and Charles Larmore's provocative essay discusses the well-known issue of skepticism.

In his philosophically rich essay, Edwin Curley presents a fascinating interpretation of the cogito.

Marleen Rozemond's impressive essay on the nature of mind emphasizes both the manner in which Descartes' theory of the mind differs from scholastic theories, and the difference between sense perception and intellectual ideas. It also includes a lengthy discussion of the 'transparency of the mental'.

Jorge Secada's essay on Cartesian substance sets the stage by contrasting the Cartesian theory of substance to that of the great counter-reformation scholastic, Francisco Suarez, and discusses the relationship between substance and modes, as well as Descartes' rejection of hylomorphism.

Stephen Nadler's entry on the doctrine of ideas covers a huge number of issues, including what Cartesian ideas are, the incorrigibility of ideas, the distinction between formal and objective reality (and its scholastic sources), and the categories of ideas in terms of their origins (i.e. innate, adventitious, and fictitious), clarity and distinctness, and material falsity.

Lawrence Nolan and Alan Nelson's essay on Descartes' Third Meditation and 'ontological' proofs for the existence of God argues, among other things, that neither are 'proofs' in a traditional sense.

Gary Hatfield addresses the infamous Cartesian Circle and various strategies to get Descartes out of it, meticulously pointing out the shortcomings of each strategy.

Michael Della Rocca's essay provides not only a very interesting discussion of judgment and will, but also a needed advertisement for the unfairly-neglected Fourth Meditation. Della Rocca critically discusses Descartes' 'error theodicy', as well as Descartes' theory of freedom and his view that belief formation is voluntary.

Desmond Clarke's essay on the argument for the existence of matter (and the nature of matter, not only in the Meditations, but the Principles and The World) is full of biting humor and repeatedly takes Descartes to task.

John Cottingham's essay discusses the mind-body relation, the problematic notion of the 'substantial union' of mind and body, and sensations, as well as less obvious issues such as the relation of Descartes' view of mind-body union to ethics and theodicy.

Tad Schmaltz concludes the entries with his discussion of seventeenth-century responses to Descartes. Schmaltz discusses the reactions of several well-known philosophers, (e.g. Spinoza, Malebranche, Leibniz), as well as some lesser-known philosophers such as Clauberg, Foucher, Desgabet, Huet, and RĂ©gis.

Finally, Gaukroger's Guide includes the 1680 English translation of the Meditations by William Molyneux, better known as one of Locke's interlocutors. Molyneux's translation is fascinating and occasionally and unintentionally funny. However, while this translation will be of interest to scholars of Descartes and early modern philosophy, surely the Cottingham, Stoothoff, and Murdoch translation (Cambridge University Press, 1984) would have been more fitting for a 'guide' to the Meditations.

Let me make it perfectly clear: The essays in the Guide are first-rate work on the important topics in the Meditations by exceptional scholars, and I found much in each of them thought-provoking. That being said, however, the news about the Guide is not all good. According to the 'mission statement' of the Blackwell Guides Series: "Each volume in this series provides guidance to those coming to the great works of the philosophical canon, whether for the first time or to gain new insight." It is true that I gained new insight into some of the topics discussed, and I expect that other specialists will find much to think and argue about. However, I suspect that many of the essays would not be accessible or helpful to someone coming to the Meditations for the first time (e.g. a typical undergraduate in an introductory philosophy course). Of course, this is bad news only in a qualified sense: I expect that upper-division philosophy majors, graduate students, and professional philosophers will benefit greatly from reading this book. But it is a bit too much to expect those without a background in philosophy to understand what is going on in some of the essays.

A similar worry concerns the possibility of uncritical acceptance by some readers. What we have in these essays are the particular interpretations of Descartes by prominent specialists. The problem is that, even when I believe that the authors have gotten Descartes right, I am still able to recognize the controversial aspects of the interpretations, and the fact that there are many scholars who disagree with the proposed interpretations. I would be concerned that a reader coming to the Meditations for the first time would uncritically come to accept the authors' interpretations. Moreover, disagreement between the authors on an issue (e.g. the transparency of the mental) may be confusing for a newcomer.

I wish to mention two more things that I found peculiar, given the stated aims of the Guide: First, although Gaukroger helpfully lists the Cottingham et al. (CSM/CSMK) volumes corresponding to volumes of Adam and Tannery's Oeuvres de Descartes (AT), all of the references to Descartes' works in each of the entries are given by the AT numbers. This is strange given that CSM/CSMK has without question become the standard English translation, and AT contains original language texts. So why not give reference both to the CSM numbers (for those 'coming for the first time') and the AT numbers (for those looking 'to gain new insight')? Finally, I don't understand why there would be untranslated French text in Roger Ariew's entry on the Objections and Replies to the Meditations. This seemed inappropriate for such a volume, and nothing would have been lost if the text had been translated into English (for those 'coming for the first time'), especially considering Ariew's talent for translation.

Given that the Meditations is primarily, though certainly not exclusively, an epistemological work, it is not surprising that certain issues come up repeatedly in the Guide. The Cartesian Circle, in addition to having its own essay, is discussed in several of the essays. Likewise, the issue of the transparency of the mental and privileged access to the content of one's own mental life receives attention from several of the authors, though, as I have mentioned, the authors do not agree on Descartes' position on these issues. Other 'themes' that appear frequently are Descartes' 'project' in the Meditations, Descartes' meditative method, and the historical and intellectual context in which Descartes wrote the Meditations.

One of the best features of the Guide is something presumably unintentional, namely the way the different essays illustrate the various ways 'to do history of philosophy'. Historians of philosophy frequently reflect (or are forced to reflect by our non-historical colleagues and students!!) on the question: 'Why study the history of philosophy?' But another question of interest is: 'How should one study the history of philosophy?' Perhaps we should simply extract arguments from the texts of the great dead philosophers without attention to historical details. (Probably not.) Should we engage the dead the way we would a contemporary philosopher? Should we be interested in what the great dead actually said or meant, or should we attempt to figure out what the dead should have said? As an illustration of one way of doing history of philosophy (and as an excuse to discuss their excellent essay), I briefly wish to discuss the essay on Descartes' proofs for the existence of God by Larry Nolan and Alan Nelson. Nolan and Nelson propose and carefully defend several controversial ideas about Descartes' proofs, one of which is the idea that Descartes' a posteriori proof in the Third Meditation does not rely on the causal principle that Descartes seems to think it does. At first glance, Descartes seems to be using a principle that Nolan and Nelson call 'OR-FR': The cause of an idea must have at least as much formal reality as the idea has objective reality. Anyone who has attempted to teach the Third Meditation knows the difficulty in explaining OR-FR, let alone convincing students that it is a principle known by the natural light of reason. Nolan and Nelson argue that rather than relying on the 'less plausible' OR-FR principle in his proof, all Descartes needs is the 'relatively innocent' principle that nothing comes from nothing, which Nolan and Nelson call 'the Causal Principle'. Of course, historians of philosophy are bound by the principle of charity too. If we should use the principle of charity when doing contemporary philosophy, we should extend the same courtesy to our deceased colleagues. Perhaps this is what Nolan and Nelson are doing. Rather than making the proof rely on the problematic OR-FR, they show how the argument works if Descartes uses the innocent Causal Principle. Surely this raises issues about our methods and goals as historians of philosophy. Consider two things: (1) Descartes spends a good deal of time discussing the OR-FR and the associated concepts of objective reality and formal reality, not only in the Third Meditation, but in other texts as well. Descartes certainly intended to use OR-FR in the proof for the existence of God. If we are interested in what Descartes intended, then Nolan and Nelson have a burden to explain the appearance of the importance of OR-FR to Descartes' a posteriori proof. Otherwise, it seems that Descartes' OR-FR is a red herring or innocuously irrelevant. In fairness to Nolan and Nelson, each approach to the history of philosophy will have its own set of burdens to meet. (2) Suppose that the Causal Principle used in Nolan and Nelson's reconstruction of Descartes' proof entailed OR-FR or that the two were equivalent. If this were the case, Nolan and Nelson may have less of a burden to explain the prominence of OR-FR in the text of the Third Meditation and its scarcity in their reconstruction of the proof. I don't wish to claim what Nolan and Nelson would say, but they could say something like: 'Yes, OR-FR is prominent, but it is equivalent to or entailed by the Causal Principle. So, even if our reconstruction of the proof doesn't explicitly rely on OR-FR, it relies on something equivalent to or which entails OR-FR. Satisfying the Causal Principle satisfies OR-FR. Thus, OR-FR is implicit even in our reconstruction of the proof.' The main problem with this hypothetical response is that Descartes seems to think that the Causal Principle is entailed by, but does not entail, OR-FR's sister principle (i.e. that there must be at least as much reality in the cause as in the effect), and there is no reason to think the entailment relation would be different between the Causal Principle and OR-FR. So, satisfying the Causal Principle does not automatically satisfy OR-FR, and hence we can still wonder about its absence from Nolan and Nelson's reconstruction of Descartes' proof of the existence of God.

Nolan and Nelson's essay is an excellent sample of one way of doing history of philosophy, and other essays in the Guide exemplify various other ways. Students of philosophy and of the history of philosophy can only benefit from seeing how people who do history for a living engage with Descartes, and from recognizing the costs, benefits, and scholarly responsibilities involved in historical philosophical scholarship. I highly recommended the Guide to philosophy majors, graduate students, historians of philosophy, and our non-historian colleagues who wish to know more about the philosophical event of the seventeenth century.