The Blackwell Guide to Hegel's Phenomenology of Spirit

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Kenneth R. Westphal (ed.), The Blackwell Guide to Hegel's Phenomenology of Spirit, Wiley-Blackwell, 2009, 325pp., $34.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781405131100.

Reviewed by Dean Moyar, Johns Hopkins University



It is no small irony that Hegel’s Phenomenology of Spirit, a book that is supposed to serve as a ladder for ordinary consciousness to reach the standpoint of Science, should itself have required scores of commentators to make its rungs intelligible and its ascent even conceivable for generations of readers. The major challenge of commenting on Hegel’s work is to stay close enough to the text that the reader feels that he can really read Hegel’s text alongside the commentary without having to bypass large stretches, while at the same time actually to interpret (rather than paraphrase) the text so that its philosophical import is evident to today’s reader. Forcing everything into one’s own interpretive framework can leave the reader disconnected from Hegel’s actual words, while just paraphrasing Hegel’s text, though reassuring for a beginning reader, does not let one connect Hegel’s philosophical project to the wealth of philosophical debates to which it is relevant. The outstanding single-author commentaries on the Phenomenology in English in the past twenty years (chief among them being Terry Pinkard’s Hegel’s Phenomenology, H.S. Harris’ Hegel’s Ladder, and Jon Stewart’s The Unity of Hegel’s Phenomenology of Spirit), managed this challenge in different ways, producing works with distinctive priorities that have together opened up the Phenomenology to a generation of students.

The Blackwell Guide to Hegel’s Phenomenology of Spirit, edited by Kenneth Westphal, is billed as a “collective commentary”. Such a collective approach can illuminate the work through multiple perspectives and by drawing on the particular strengths of the commentators, each of whom can write on that stretch of text that he/she know best. However, the collective approach also runs the risk of producing a number of isolated contributions that leaves the reader in the dark about the interconnections of systematic unity of the whole. The relative strengths and weaknesses of such a commentary largely stem from how “collective” it really is - whether there has been a truly collaborative effort, including some agreement on a rough interpretive framework, mutual commenting on each other’s contributions, etc.

Westphal’s volume is “collective” in a rather minimal sense. There does not appear to have been any joint work in conceiving of the specific or general interpretive approach in the essays. (I should mention here that the volume of essays on the Phenomenology edited by myself and Michael Quante, though also a “guide” to the text and thus something of a competitor to the present book, was conceived neither as collective nor as commentary.) Westphal writes in his Introduction that the book “develops a significant consensus about the integrity of Hegel’s text and issues. This point is examined expressly in chapters 1, 12, and 13, while chapters 10 and 11 say much about it too” (xvii). The “integrity” at issue concerns whether all the diverse parts of the Phenomenology hang together, or whether it is really two projects hurriedly and clumsily melded into one. While it is true that the authors in this work seem to agree that Hegel was in control of his text and are sympathetic to the overall project, it is not clear to this reader what “significant consensus” is developed. There have not been many recent defenders of the view that Hegel’s text lacks integrity, so the mere fact that these authors assume such an integrity is not terribly significant. The discussions of the basic method and goals in the chapters do not complement each other, but rather lead the reader to various different (and necessarily incomplete) views of Hegel’s goals and method.

This is not to say that each of the essays dos not stand on its own. This is a very impressive collection of essays by some of the most acute readers working on Hegel today. Yet as a commentary, the whole is less than the sum of its parts. Each contribution is well worth reading, both for the new and seasoned reader of the Phenomenology, yet one is left without a clear grip on Hegel’s main philosophical innovations and without a reliable way to translate Hegel’s prose into a more philosophically fungible idiom.

My strategy in reviewing this complex book is to give most attention to the five essays (1, 2, 4, 12, 13) that directly concern the methodology and overall aims of Hegel’s project. I will offer some brief summary comments on the remaining eight chapters, most of which are concerned with the “practical” parts of the Phenomenology, where the controversies are less severe. It is uncontroversial, for example, that Hegel argues for the insufficiency of individualist models of practical rationality and the need for a model of social normativity that he calls Spirit. There remain important controversies over the particulars of that account, but at least the general nature of his claims is comprehensible. By contrast, the material at the beginning and end of the Phenomenology raises most pressingly such contested issues as whether Hegel is best read as a transcendental idealist or as a spirit monist, in what sense the Phenomenology should be considered a “deduction” of the concept of science, in what sense consciousness is cancelled, preserved, and/or elevated through the completed process, etc.

It is unfortunate that in his opening chapter Westphal takes on too much material for a single short essay. He aims to unpack the Phenomenology‘s Introduction and the three chapters that together form “Consciousness”. The concise summary of the Introduction, focusing on Sextus Empiricus’ “Dilemma of the Criterion”, and Hegel’s response, is an efficient sketch of the Phenomenology‘s method. Westphal reads the method as “constructive self-criticism” that arrives at “a sufficient criterion of the truth of an epistemology” (4, 5). He recognizes the complex interplay of conceptions of the object and self-conceptions that make the Phenomenology such a challenging work. Westphal brings out the self-critical component of “Sense-Certainty” by likening the claim of “Sense-Certainty” to the concept-free “knowledge by acquaintance” defended by Bertrand Russell. The constructive side of Westphal’s account of Sense-Certainty is quite a bit harder to grasp in this compressed format. He writes, “More constructively, in ‘Sense-Certainty’ Hegel reconstructs and defends Kant’s semantics of cognitive reference while liberating this semantics from Kant’s transcendental idealism” (6). Deciphering what it means to be liberated from Kant’s transcendental idealism is no small feat. Westphal could just be saying that Hegel rejects the Kantian conception of things in themselves, or of objects for us as opposed to objects considered apart from the pure intuitions of space and time. Fair enough. But one could also argue that the key doctrine of Kant’s idealism is the transcendental unity of apperception, and it is precisely this doctrine that Hegel seeks to establish in the chapters on “Consciousness”. Westphal actually notes that the three chapters aim “to prove that we can be conscious of objects in the world around us only if we are self-conscious” (20). But this seems to be a core thesis of transcendental idealism, not a liberation from it.

Westphal’s account of “Perception” offers a reliable guide to Hegel’s critique of the view that perception consists in a passive subject apprehending an object with multiple properties. Westphal argues that Hegel is giving a critique of “Concept Empiricism” that results in a claim about the integrative powers of human cognition, including the claim that "the concept of the identity of perceptible things … is a priori" (14). Presenting the subsequent section, “Force and Understanding”, Westphal moves from commentary on to summary of what he claims are Hegel’s positive conclusions about the nature of force, substance, and Newtonian universal gravitation. Readers will find it hard to connect these theses to Hegel’s very difficult text, in which he rarely speaks in a voice of assertion. But Westphal does put his finger on a key point in Hegel analysis, which is that modern philosophy equivocates on the concept of substance. Are the “intrinsic” properties those that are non-relational, or are they those that are essential? Westphal rightly notes that Hegel’s discussion turns on revealing the neglected option that relational properties can be essential to a substance.

Though filled with such important insights, Westphal’s essay is problematic in that it tries to do too much within too little space, and in that it asserts a reading of the Phenomenology that is more likely to confuse rather than enlighten the reader of the remaining commentary. A major issue here is that Westphal is bent on asserting his realist reading of Hegel’s epistemology, even though the chapters under discussion are not those in which realist arguments, if there really are any in the Phenomenology, are to be found. He writes,

Hegel argues that we human beings cannot be self-conscious and cannot be aware of any ‘mental’ contents unless we are conscious of and identify at least some features of objects or events within our surroundings, which are what they are regardless of what we say, think, or believe about them (20).

He repeats this thesis in his summary of the entire Phenomenology and the concluding table that summarizes the whole book. He states that both parts of the “Self-Consciousness” chapter aim to argue for realism about objects, and that Hegel gives a version of Kant’s “Refutation of Idealism” that does not rely on transcendental idealism. In the present essay this realism claim comes across as a mantra, never justified, and given that subsequent authors do not focus on such a realist thesis, it does not aid the overall purpose of the collection. This essay appears to be a compressed version of the book manuscript mentioned in Westphal’s biographical note (“Hegel’s Critique of Cognitive Judgment: From Naïve Realism to Understanding”). Readers puzzled and provoked by Westphal’s interpretation can consult the forthcoming book or the works in the “Further Reading” section, where 17 of the 18 works listed are Westphal’s own publications.

If anything it is Hegel’s idealism that is emphasized in the second essay, Frederick Neuhouser’s “Desire, Recognition, and the Relation between Bondsman and Lord”. This extraordinarily clear commentary on the crucial first half of the “Self-Consciousness” chapter begins with a statement that self-consciousness does not attempt to know an object but rather “to ‘satisfy itself’” (37). The theme of satisfaction could serve as a basis for reading the entire book (as in Pippin’s classic Hegel’s Idealism: The Satisfactions of Self-Consciousness). Neuhouser goes in a somewhat different direction, however, by introducing the idea of a “self-conception” as "a description under which a subject values itself" (38). Neuhouser is drawing here on Christine Korsgaard’s conception of practical identity, which he employed to good effect in his Foundations of Hegel’s Social Theory. The self-conception at issue in Chapter IV is that of a free activity, such that “one will want to act in ways that realize, or express, the value of independent sovereignty” (38). I cannot go through Neuhouser’s excellent reconstruction of the text. I will instead pick up his value reading at the close of the Lord/Bondsman dialectic. There he describes the Bondsman’s fear of death as allowing him to learn

the capacity for ‘absolute negativity’, … In the fear of death everything about a person that previously seemed fixed and stable is shaken loose and dissolved; every particular property that seemed to define that person now ceases to matter in relation to one supreme, overriding value: remaining alive (51).

The bondsman has acquired the formal capacity for absolute negativity, but he remains unfree in that “his criterion of the good is mere life” (51). The conflict with the lord and the servitude to the lord are educative, for they prepare the way for the free subject who can tear himself loose from all given determinations. Of course only through the subsequent dialectic of self-consciousness does the bondsman come to see his own activity as universal, and he thus orients his activity around “a single, overriding spiritual value, the realization of freedom” (53). Though Neuhouser’s value reading is promising as a framework for reading the text as a whole, no other essay frames its issues in terms of value, so a reader might be left puzzled about how to link the basic dynamics of self-consciousness to the subject’s development in later chapters.

In his essay on the second half of “Self-Consciousness”, Franco Chiereghin calls our attention to the fact that only at this point in the Phenomenology does “thinking” come on the scene. The identity of subject and object in thinking is at issue in the shapes of “Stoicism”, “Skepticism”, and “The Unhappy Consciousness”, through which Chiereghin deftly guides the reader. His discussion of “Skepticism” is especially useful, as he uses it to thematize determinate negation. He fruitfully brings in the early Jena Skepticism essay to show how the Pyronnhian “trope of relativity” is also essential to the Phenomenology‘s method (62). This essay thus helps to flesh out the picture of the method from Westphal’s discussion of the Introduction.

Cinzia Ferrini’s first essay is on the introduction to “Reason”, which is indeed an underexamined turning point in the Phenomenology and thus fully warrants a chapter of its own. The importance of these paragraphs is clear in that Hegel repeats in altered form his claim from the Introduction that the basic problem that the Phenomenology is supposed to address is that Science comes on the scene immediately and thus needs to justify itself. The standpoint of Reason’s idealism cannot simply be assumed. It needs a deduction, which is just what Hegel claims to have given thus far in the Phenomenology. His criticism of Kant and Fichte raises the question of whether Hegel’s own ultimate philosophical position is a basically Kantian idealism, one much better grounded but nonetheless recognizably a transcendental idealism. Within this context Hegel also seems to endorse the Kantian doctrine of apperception, and he laments the “scandal of philosophy” that is Kant’s lack of derivation of the categories. To highlight the engagement with Kant and Fichte, Ferrini brings forth relevant texts from the prePhenomenology writings, and raises a number of important points about the relation to the natural scientific inquiry that Hegel engages in the subsequent “Observing Reason” section. Readers looking for a key to the Phenomenology as a whole might be frustrated by statements such as this:

To sum up the dialectical movement of this section: although reason is in truth only the universality of things, reason tries to possess herself in natural things and not in their essentiality qua talis; because natural consciousness’s knowing takes sensuous things as opposed to the ‘I’, it neglects that reason is present in her own proper shape only in the conceptual inwardness of objective thinghood. (79)

I think I know what Ferrini means in writing of “conceptual inwardness”, but this passage raises a number of questions, such as how to characterize the holism within which this talk of inwardness makes sense. Ferrini unfortunately neglects the most important (and most perplexing) paragraphs in this text, namely those in which Hegel reconstructs Fichte’s dialectical derivation of the categories in an account that ends in singularity (Einzelnheit). Since this is the term that Hegel sometimes uses to describe his own version of transcendental self-consciousness, namely the Concept, it could have been a good point to discuss just how Hegel’s method has progressed beyond the Fichtean dialectic.

Ferrini’s discussion of Reason and the empirical sciences does provide a good introduction to her second essay, on “Observing Reason”. This essay is a real outlier in the collection because of its bulky scholarly apparatus: there are eight pages of references and ten pages of footnotes. It will be a valuable resource for specialists trying to discern the sources of Hegel’s treatment of natural science, and will offer newcomers at least the reassurance that Hegel was engaged with the scientific work of his time. Ferrini has given us a new road map for understanding Hegel’s difficult claims about biological sciences in particular.

The essays by Terry Pinkard and David Couzens Hoy cover the last two main sections of “Reason”. The shapes of consciousness in these sections are much more readily grasped than previous shapes, in large part because they are explicitly practical shapes of action or agency (the challenge is more to link these to the basic epistemological description of the project). Pinkard frames his discussion of shapes of modern individualism through the idea of a “missing antinomy” in Kant: “On the one hand, we are always completely socially constituted and our normative status is derivative from that; and on the other hand, we are free, self-originating sources of claims that no claim of social utility may override” (138-39). Examining the “law of the heart”, “virtue”, and “the honest consciousness” as so many individualistic attempts to resolve this antinomy, Pinkard provides a subtle and entertaining account of why the antinomy is unresolvable without making the transition to Spirit.

Picking up the text at the point where “Law-giving Reason” comes on the scene, Hoy stages a contest between Hegel and Kant, oddly enough by citing Rawls’ lectures on Hegel and contrasting Rawls’ Hegel with Christine Korsgaard’s version of Kant. Hoy argues that Hegel’s criticisms of Kantian morality are not fully answered by Korsgaard’s defense. Hoy emphasizes that Hegel’s examples are designed to show that law-based accounts cannot handle the “interpretive variability” of ethical situations (162). He ends by defending Hegel’s social account of Ethical Life against the charge that it forfeits any critical distance on a society’s existing norms.

In the “Spirit” chapter Hegel quickly turns from immediate social unity to the conflicts within the ethical life of the ancient Greek polis. Jocelyn Hoy’s essay focuses on the conflict between human and divine law that Hegel expounds through his controversial interpretation of Sophocles’ Antigone. The core of her essay is a discussion of ten charges against Hegel by feminist theorists, charges concerning both his views on women generally and his use of Antigone in particular. She analyzes these charges with the aim of showing “that Hegel’s claims about sexual difference and gender roles need to be contextualized in terms of his dialectical strategy” (186). The essay succeeds remarkably well at this task, and brings the dialectical strategy into vivid relief by contrasting it with flatfooted attacks on isolated claims leveled from outside the dialectic.

Jürgen Stolzenberg provides a careful reconstruction of Hegel’s critique of the Enlightenment, with especially strong attention to the need to streamline Hegel’s argument and relate it in a straightforward way to the aims of the book as a whole. Stolzenberg offers his own take on what Spirit in general is, calling Hegel’s account "a critical-structural theory of models of world-interpretation" (192). Though differing from the other views of Spirit represented in the other essays, in this practical realm these differences do not prevent the reader from getting a grip on the interconnections of the sections. Stolzenberg gives simple statements of what he calls “the Principle of Consciousness” and the “Principle of Spirit”, and shows that Hegel’s presentation of the Enlightenment’s struggle with superstition, and its misunderstanding of that struggle, result from the interplay of these two principles (194). In particular, the Enlightenment relates to faith/superstition as consciousness, which has the fundamental principle of opposing something to itself. It can therefore treat faith only in a critical, destructive manner, rather than reaching “the insight into the articulated fundamental constitution of the structure of spirit” (201, 203). Instead of such an insight the Enlightenment officially ends with the French Revolution and the Terror, leaving the reconciliation to take place within the realm of morality.

Both the essay on “Morality” by Frederick Beiser and the essay by George di Giovanni on the “Religion” chapter focus on the greatest moment of reconciliation in the Phenomenology, the confession and forgiveness that forms the transition from Morality to Religion. Characteristically begrudging in his assessment of Hegel, Beiser writes of this moment of absolute recognition that it stands out from “the crabbed prose” that the “tired reader”, “battered and bruised”, finally reaches after the “remarkably obscure even by Hegelian standards” introduction to “Morality” (209, 210). The “grumpy reader”, the “impatient reader” finally reaches a lucid point of progress over Hegel’s romantic and idealist contemporaries (210). Beiser’s summary of “Morality” illuminates the reconciliation less than Giovanni’s essay, which is officially about the “Religion” chapter, but which instead reviews the place of religion in the rest of the Phenomenology. Giovanni uses the theme of recognition in confession and forgiveness to return to the struggle for recognition in the “Self-Consciousness” chapter, juxtaposing the two as struggles in which nature and freedom each play crucial roles. This sets up Giovanni’s most novel formulation: “religious praxis had indeed been in general, from the beginning, spirit’s response to the anonymous power of enchanted nature” (232). He gives a dense review of this praxis, in Greek ethical life, Rome, the world of “Culture”, and the Enlightenment, before returning to the scene of confession and forgiveness. Giovanni ends with a brief but provocative discussion of “what would count as religion in a post-Christian culture” (243). That there must be something to so count follows from the fact that “religion, both as cult and faith, is for Hegel existentially necessary” (243).

Coming straight from Giovanni’s essay, readers might be surprised by Allegra de Laurentiis’s claim in her essay on “Absolute Knowing” that “revealed religion is necessarily deceitful” (253). Despite some rather misleading claims like this, de Laurentiis does provide an engaging commentary on Hegel’s very dense and difficult text. She aims to show that Hegel thinks his accomplishment is to establish a “structural identity” between thinking and the objects of thought. “Absolute Knowing” is the knowing of the logical structure of the self, and that this logical structure is the structure of objectivity as well. De Laurentiis calls this “Hegel’s modern, critical version of Scholastic realism, the mediaeval, anti-nominalist reinterpretation of fundamental theses of Platonic and Aristotelian metaphysics” (246). I am not sure how helpful it is to call this a “version of Scholastic realism”, since so much depends on how the “modern” and “critical” are taken. An awful lot of interpretive controversy can be masked by appeals to the “structure” of subjectivity and objectivity. As de Laurentiis explains, the fundamental logical structure for Hegel is the Schluss, the inference or syllogism. She takes these syllogisms to be the realization of Spirit’s potential, "like the entelechia of Aristotle’s intellect", and no doubt it is like Aristotle’s theory given Hegel’s citation of Aristotle at key points in his corpus (262). The “structural identity” claim could also be the basis for reading Hegel as an inferentialist, as a semantic theorist for whom any objective content or meaning depends on the subjective processes of belief formation and revision. Or the structural identity could just be the Kantian claim that the conditions for the possibility of knowledge of objects are just what constitute those objects. The “structural identity” claim is correct as far as it goes, but we should read it as opening up rather than deciding the most important interpretive questions.

I end my review of the individual essays with Marina Bykova’s contribution. We are told in the Introduction to the collection that “Central themes of Hegel’s Preface are considered in” Bykova’s essay, which comes last because the Preface was the last part of the book written (xvii). A bit later we are told that the essay is about subjectivity, and subjectivity is “emphasized in his Preface” (xxiv). Perhaps enough ink has been spilled on the strange text that was supposed to serve as the Preface to Hegel’s entire system. But it was in the Preface that Hegel reflects on what he just accomplished, and it seems problematic not to have any discussion of this text in a work aiming to be a collective commentary. Bykova provides in effect an overview of the development of subjectivity in the Phenomenology. This is a fruitful approach, though given that the goal is to reach the identity of subject and object, it seems that an overview could just as fruitfully focus on objectivity. My real issue with this essay, however, is the way in which Bykova describes the literature on the Phenomenology. She claims that her essay will avoid an “approach typical of German scholarship” which focuses on “cosmic spirit” and “downplays (or even ignores) Hegel’s account of the individual human being” (265, 266). On the other side, she claims to avoid the mistakes of the Anglophone reading, which gives “‘spirit’ an insignificant, secondary role” because they are individualistic and focused on epistemological issues (266). This picture of the field is not at all accurate. If there is a real contrast that lies behind Bykova’s opposition, it is between the German literature’s preference for a neo-Platonic “metaphysical” Hegel and the Anglophone tendency to read him as more of a post-Kantian idealist. But the Anglophone readings of, say, Pippin and Pinkard (both of whom she cites), are thoroughly social and suffer from none of the one-sidedness she associates with them. On the German side as well, commentators offer quite nuanced accounts of the individual and epistemological dimensions of the Phenomenology (the “cosmic spirit” reading is most associated with Charles Taylor). The work by the authors in this collection itself is ample evidence that Hegel scholars no longer fall neatly into the basic opposition of individual and social.

With each new book on the Phenomenology we find new insights and along with them new reason to think that the task of interpretation and appropriation is nowhere near complete. The essays in this volume provide many accessible points of entry into Hegel’s thought. Scholars and teachers of Hegel’s most rewarding and perplexing work should be grateful.