The Bloomsbury Research Handbook of Indian Aesthetics and the Philosophy of Art

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Arindam Chakrabarti (ed.), The Bloomsbury Research Handbook of Indian Aesthetics and the Philosophy of Art, Bloomsbury, 2016, 417pp., $172.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781472528353.

Reviewed by Jay L Garfield, Smith College/Yale-NUS College


Aesthetics, while always somewhat peripheral to Western philosophy, has always been at the center of Indian philosophy. It is therefore essential, if one wants to understand debates in Indian philosophy, to attend to Indian aesthetic theory. Moreover, because of this centrality, Indian aesthetic theory has evolved in continuous debate over millennia into a sophisticated and contested body of theory. It is therefore a rich source of aesthetic insight for anyone interested in aesthetics per se.

Indian aesthetic theory differs in its orientation from much Western aesthetic theory in certain respects. First, while most Western aestheticians take the core cases of art to be enduring visible objects such as painting or sculpture, Indian aestheticians take as the paradigm work of art the nāṭya performance -- religious dance theatre. Second, Indian aesthetic theory takes as its primary analytical category the idea of rasa, a term sometimes translated as taste or as essence or as aesthetic emotion, with important debates concerning the number of rasa-s, their relationship to more transient or subsidiary emotions (bhāva-s), and whether rasa is properly located in the work of art itself or in the rasika (the aesthetic subject). So, any aesthetician interested in the different ways in which aesthetic judgment is conceived across intellectual traditions should find Indian aesthetics interesting.

It is therefore cause for celebration that a scholarly anthology addressing Indian aesthetic theory is now available, and a cause for further celebration that it is a very good anthology, covering a substantial range of Indian aesthetic concerns. Moreover, since Indian philosophy is very much alive, it is a very good thing that this anthology does not only address classical Sanskrit Indian aesthetic theory (although it does that) but also addresses contemporary Indian art and contemporary Indian aesthetic speculation, reflecting both the long Indian tradition and its interaction with Western philosophy. Arindam Chakrabarti himself is a prominent scholar of Indian philosophy and of Indian aesthetics, and has invited contributions from significant luminaries in the field. This volume merits study and could serve as the basis for courses in aesthetics or in Indian philosophy.

Chakrabarti's introduction is erudite and informative, and is itself a valuable contribution to the literature on Indian aesthetics, as well as an effective frame for the essays he commissioned. Chakrabarti alerts the reader both to the distinctive features of the Indian tradition and, importantly, to the diversity both of art forms and of ways of thinking about art in India, pointing out that rasa theory, with its taxonomy of aesthetic properties and responses, is well-placed to make sense of this wonderful (adbhuta) variety.

Chakrabarti's introduction provides the reader more at home in Western philosophy with a very fine short introduction to rasa theory and to the history of Indian aesthetics. While there is a great deal more that could be said, he says enough to make it possible for one with little or no experience of this tradition to read most of the essays in the volume with understanding. His discussion is noteworthy for its expository clarity as well as for the way that he anchors the claims he makes about aesthetic response and judgment in particular objects of aesthetic appreciation, both Indian and Western, and in the classic Indian aesthetic treatises of Bharata (c 5th C CE) and Abhinavagupta (c 950-1020 CE). His brief summaries of the essays place each in context and guide the reader through the collection. I will comment on some of the most important of the eighteen essays.

The anthology proper opens with a superb essay by Lawrence McCrea on a central theoretical construct in medieval Kashmiri philosophy of language and poetic theory, that of dhvani, which McCrea translates felicitously as resonance. The term, having a root sense of echo, is also often rendered in the context of poetics or pragmatics as allusion or suggestion. McCrea explores the debates about the relationship between literal and figurative meaning and about the semantic and pragmatic roots of dhvani in 9th-11th century Kashmiri philosophical literature, addressing both the debates about the relationship between dhvani and inference (anumana) and the ways in which dhvani is connected to rasa in poetics. The discussion is philologically precise and philosophically fascinating. In a concluding section, McCrea argues persuasively that these debates themselves have echoes well into 16th century Indian philosophy of language. This essay provides important historical context for some of the discussions that follow.

Priyadarshi Patnaik's essay on the global relevance of rasa as an analytical category is less successful. The essay is well-conceived and argues for a plausible thesis, viz., that rasa theory has application well beyond the domain of Indian art, although it may not be universally applicable. Patnaik argues that certain Western works of art are not suitable for analysis in terms of rasa, for instance, while others are. I am persuaded by most of Patnaik's more general claims about the possibilities and limits of the extension of rasa theory, but the arguments for his central theses are at best indicated, not presented in detail. The fact that he acknowledges this in the closing paragraph does little to mitigate the feeling that this is a promising but not altogether satisfactory essay.

Parul Dave-Mukherji is an art historian and aesthetician of great international stature, and her contribution is superb. Dave-Mukherji investigates Indian accounts of the role of anukṛti (which she translates felicitously, although somewhat apologetically, as mimesis) in Indian aesthetic theory. The essay is extraordinarily rich, and ties together discussion of Indian art historical practice -- with especially insightful discussion of the thought of Ananda K Coomaraswamy (1887-1947) -- Abhinavagupta's discussion of the role of anukṛti in the genesis of rasa and of the relationship of anukṛti to inference, and the implications of classical theory of anukṛti to contemporary aesthetic discourse. The discussion is erudite, closely argued and very rewarding.

Mukund Lath is an aesthetician and musicologist well-known in India, but less familiar to Western scholars. I am very pleased to see his essay included. He explores the connections between music and language, and through language to discursive thought. His principal object of aesthetic inquiry is Indian classical music, and so some of the points he makes may be a bit obscure to the reader not familiar with that tradition. Nonetheless, as he explores the connections between the reflexive and recursive nature of musical development and that of language and thought, and connects this structure to the evocation of rasa, real insight into musical beauty emerges.

Bijoy H. Boruah contributes a superb exploration of the role of the imagination and of consideration of the possible in aesthetic experience. He focuses on the appreciation of fiction and of the importance of emotional arousal by narratives we know to be fictional. Rather than explain this in terms of identification, as one might expect, Boruah follows both Schopenhauer and Bhattacharyya in emphasizing the role of detached contemplation in the cultivation of explicitly aesthetic emotional response. This is a fine essay in systematic aesthetic theory, and at the same time, it takes the reader to historical roots both in the European and the Indian traditions.

Chakrabarti’s essay is also very fine. He shows us just how fecund rasa theory is as a source of aesthetic insight. By focusing on ugliness and the disgusting as aesthetic objects, Chakrabarti demonstrates the poverty of any aesthetic approach that regards the appreciation of beauty as the essential aesthetic experience, and argues for the broader range of aesthetic ideas represented in rasa theory. His detailed application of rasa theory is particularly helpful and his attention to contemporary as well as to classical art and to Western as well as Indian art makes the account all the more plausible.

Sudipta Kaviraj explores late 19th and early 20th century Bengali approaches to literature and to the visual arts, with special attention to the thought and the art of Bankim Chandra Chattopadhyay (1838-1894), Abanindranath Tagore (1871-1951) and Rabindranath Tagore (1861-1941). Kaviraj demonstrates the importance of systematic reflection on the artistic and philosophical traditions of the past for the artistic practice and the philosophical thought of colonial Bengal. In doing so, he articulates the essentially temporal nature of aesthetic reflection as well as the centrality of art and aesthetic discourse to the construction of Indian modernity. This essay is an important contribution both to Indian aesthetics and to Indian intellectual history more broadly.

David Shulman's essay on the South Indian Kūṭiyāṭṭam tradition of dance theatre is fascinating. He draws on his own experience in the audience of many days-long Kūṭiyāṭṭam performances. His description is rich and textured, and his account of the kind of perceptual attention the drama demands -- what he calls deep seeing -- is highly suggestive. Shulman connects the aesthetic response to this kind of performance to Advaita Vedānta metaphysics, but only obliquely. Much of his aesthetic reflection is highly original, powerful, and demands careful consideration. Here we have contemporary aesthetic reflection on a classical Indian art, informed by the Indian philosophical tradition, but not beholden to it.

Gopal Guru's essay stands out for its political focus. While he begins with reflections on the differential aesthetic responses to leather depending on its context, his real focus is on the aesthetic response of upper caste Hindus to dalits. Caste relations are most often theorized in religious, political or economic terms, but too little attention is given to the aesthetic dimensions of the response to otherness and to perceived pollution. This essay draws welcome attention to this issue, and thereby to an underappreciated political dimension of aesthetic theory -- the question of the role of our aesthetic response to those we denigrate in political and social oppression. This essay demands deep reflection on these issues.

Tapati Guha-Thakurta (following her excellent In the Name of the Goddess: The Durga Pujas of Contemporary Kolkata, Primus 2015) addresses another dimension of contemporary aesthetic practice in the public sphere. She explores with wonderful nuance the shifting boundary between sacred and secular, craft and art, festival and gallery in the context of Kolkata's stupendous Durga Puja, an event in which neighborhoods and teams of artists and apprentices compete in increasingly lavish and imaginative displays of the goddess Durga and her retinue. She shows how at the same time the sacred is becoming more secular and commercial, and how craft is becoming redefined as public fine art. This is a fine essay in contemporary aesthetic practice, in a uniquely Indian context.

Moinak Biswas also contributes to the discussion of contemporary aesthetic practice in his discussion of the potential of film as understood from the standpoint of rasa theory. Biswas draws effectively on Bhattacharyya's discussion of rasa and his account of aesthetic experience as involving freedom from the object, but also Chakrabarti's own discussion of the role of the image of space, or the empty sky (akasa) as a metaphor for the universal experience implicated in aesthetic experience to explore the importance of cinematic representations of sky for this purpose. He reads films by Satyajit Ray (1921-1992), who drew heavily on the aesthetic theory of Rabindranath Tagore, effectively to this purpose.

As I have suggested, this is a very fine -- if sometimes uneven -- anthology, and I recommend it to anyone wanting a sense of the history and present, and of the philosophical richness of Indian aesthetic theory. I do want to close with a few critical comments.

First, some of the essays are simply unsuccessful, both as philosophical explorations and as points of entry for the nonspecialist. Nrisinha Prasad Bhaduri's on the erotic in Indian poetry is too disorganized and fragmentary to do much, and aims at no discernible conclusion. Sibaji Bandyopadhyay's essay on aesthetic borrowing is shapeless and underargued. B. N. Goswamy offers tantalizing readings of Mughal and Rajput paintings (with some lovely plates), but never theorizes or draws larger conclusions from these. The essay feels like the first section of a larger piece we would have loved to have read. Rimli Bhattacharya, who, like Shulman, with whose essay hers is juxtaposed, writes about dance theatre, offers more an unstructured set of observations than a systematic essay. Kazi Khaleed Ashraf's essay on the representation of hermits' huts is a sound essay in art history but does not address aesthetic theory, although one can imagine ways to take it in that direction. Tridip Suhrud's essay, ostensibly on Gandhian aesthetics is a revisitation of well-trodden ground in Gandhi exegesis, and is thin on any aesthetic reflection. Each of these pieces could have benefitted from a stronger editorial hand, as each could be revised into a valuable contribution. Gayatri Chakravorty Spivak's essay, on the other hand, should simply have been omitted. It is self-indulgent, unargued, and has no discernible connection to the topic of the anthology.

Second, there are issues about the use of Sanskrit in an English language volume addressed primarily to an Anglophone world: Many Sanskrit terms are left untranslated. This is fine for a specialist volume for Indologists, but will alienate some English readers. Moreover, some crucial terms are translated inconsistently, with no attention called to that inconsistency. Rasa, for instance is translated in different essays as taste, rapture, aesthetic emotion and juice. Each of these choices is justifiable; and it is often justifiable to translate the same term very differently in different contexts. But the editor should call the reader's attention to the reasons for distinct translations if uniformity is not to be imposed. This is not done. The volume also lacks a glossary. Given the amount of Sanskrit used, this is a serious omission.

Third, the anthology lacks other apparatus one would hope to find in a research volume. There is no unified bibliography, forcing the reader to find references in the individual chapter bibliographies. There is no list of contributors. So, the reader who does not already know of the contributors has no sense of who each is in the world of Indian aesthetic theory. And finally, although one of the strengths of this volume is the degree of synergy between essays, achieved through frequent references to common touchstones such as the painting and aesthetic theory of Abanindranath Tagore, Rabindranath Tagore's aesthetic theory, the work of KC Bhattacharyya or the art historical and aesthetic work of Ananda Kentish Coomaraswamy, there is no cross-referencing within the text. This is an important editorial task in such a volume, and it has been left undone.

Finally, I lament the price. At $172 this is a volume unlikely to find its way into the collections of the many scholars who would benefit from it. We can only hope for an affordable paperback edition in the not-too-distant future.