The Bodhisattva's Brain: Buddhism Naturalized

Placeholder book cover

Owen Flanagan, The Bodhisattva's Brain: Buddhism Naturalized, MIT Press, 2011, 264pp., $27.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780262016049.

Reviewed by Christian Coseru, College of Charleston


Owen Flanagan's The Bodhisattva's Brain: Buddhism Naturalized is an oddly captivating book, part reportage and part philosophical manifesto, delivered as an impassioned series of vignettes. The "oddity" of the book stems largely from what it sets out to accomplish (and how): a critical account of what has by now become the burgeoning enterprise of neuroscientific research on the effects of Buddhist forms of meditation on health and well-being, and of the widely shared but -- on Flanagan's account -- unsupported view that the brains of highly trained Buddhists reveal their owners to be unusually happy. The neuroscientific data, he argues, is inconclusive. Buddhism provides at best a modus vivendi that shares many features with the Aristotelian model of virtue ethics and, as such, is less special than some of its more ardent proponents would have it. It does not mean, however, that Buddhism does not offer something unique and special; it just isn't what those who champion the science of happiness think it is.

Flanagan is among the first philosophers (along with Patricia Churchland, Charles Taylor, and Elliot Sober) to participate in the Mind and Life series of scientific encounters between the Dalai Lama and groups of prominent scientists that began over two decades ago. The book could also be read as a personal philosophical odyssey chronicling the various theoretical and scientific spinoffs from the eighth Mind and Life conference, in Dharamsala, India in 2000, which Flanagan attended. That meeting, which was intended both as a contribution to understanding the role of emotions in a cross-cultural perspective and as an important step in reclaiming affective cognition for neuroscience and psychology, arguably marked a turning point in the exchange between Buddhism and science. Where the immediately preceding dialogues had sought to draw parallels between Buddhism and quantum physics, domains of investigation that diverge considerably, the eighth conference aimed to find in the sciences of the mind a natural ally (for Buddhism), given that both share a common interest in exploring the potential of human cognition. To this exploration, it was claimed, Buddhism brings a first person phenomenological perspective that the science of cognition has only recently began to develop (or adopt from the Western phenomenological tradition). To be sure, mapping mental states onto brain functions, even with the aid of skilled meditators, is still a complex and controversial undertaking. But the discovery of the brain's neuroplasticity lends credibility to the view that cultivating positive mental and emotional states can have lasting effects on any individual, regardless of her cultural, biological and psychological makeup.

The Bodhisattva's Brain will serve advocates and critics of a Buddhist type of moral psychology alike by its sorting through and critically examining research that claims to describe, categorize, and measure the wide variety of mental and bodily states associated with Buddhist forms of moral and meditative cultivation. In many ways, this work continues a project that Flanagan began in his last book, The Really Hard Problem: Meaning in a Material World (MIT Press, 2007), where he asked the hard question of whether there could be a scientific inquiry into what is the best way to live that "need not be reductive, eliminativist, or disenchanting" (36). There, Flanagan drew mainly from such contemporary moral thinkers as Amartya Sen, John Rawls, and Martha Nussbaum, as well as from the relevant empirical literature on subjective well-being by Daniel Kahneman, Ed Diener, Joshua Green, and Jonathan Haidt, among others, laying down a path that sought to straddle evolutionary biology and cultural history.

In The Bodhisattva's Brain, Flanagan draws from (and takes issue with) neuroscientific studies on the positive effects of meditative practice, particularly associated with the work of Richard Davidson, John Kabat-Zinn, Antoine Lutz, and Giuseppe Pagnoni. Such studies, which have shown that there are significant and unusual oscillatory patterns in the brains of highly trained meditators, might be read as suggesting a strong link between various meditative states and psychological well-being. Flanagan resurrects an old idea (first articulated by Nathan Katz in a 1978 paper on "Language, Epistemology, and Mysticism") that one ought to be suspicious of claims that certain first-person methods reveal something fundamental about the nature of mind: methods determine outcomes, and one effectively experiences whatever one has trained oneself to experience. There is no universal condition of genuine happiness whose neural signature in the brain would establish it as such. Buddhists, Aristotelians, utilitarians, hedonists, and Trappist monks presumably all operate with different notions of what it means to flourish, and for Flanagan such variance ought to -- at least in principle -- thwart any efforts to establish a neural basis for such flourishing.

Despite this apparent skepticism about the possibility of closing the explanatory gap between science and experience anytime soon, the book does advance a naturalist account of mental causation, which assumes (or at least insists that we ought to assume) that mental states are neurally realized. Flanagan is mindful that "even the best scientific work does not yet reveal how even simple conscious percepts, seeing a red patch, seeing a particularly bent paper clip, are realized" (87). But there is an obvious tension in Flanagan's naturalism project. On the one hand, he declaims that "neutrality of the metaphysics of mind is not a live option" (90) (regardless of whether one is an identity theorist, that is, takes mental states to be identical with their neural correlates, or adopts the "weaker" neural correlates view, which states that mental states correlate with brain events, but are not reducible to the latter).  On the other hand, he does not hesitate to remark that "subjectively experienced states" may perhaps "have sui generis properties that are nonphysical" (52). By expressing hope that the identity theory may at least work for basic sensations, while at the same time shying away from epiphenomenalism, Flanagan could be offering us a more moderate version of naturalism. Readers will be left wondering why, then, he would claim that the best explanation for why, say, "intentions to act . . . are causally efficacious" is because "they are neural events" (65).

Flanagan brings to his critique a wonderfully wry and keenly acute sense of observation, as he reports (both from the far-flung centers of Buddhism in Asia and the neo-Buddhist communities of cosmopolitan America) what goes on in the name of Buddhist flourishing or, to use his idiosyncratic superscripting aimed at tagging the specific use of the term, eudaimoniaBuddha. As a participant in the activities of the Mind and Life Institute, Flanagan is also privy to what those, like the Dalai Lama and his entourage (who both embody and represent one specific tradition of Buddhist theory and practice), say behind closed doors, so to speak. That is, he knows that even some of Buddhism's best known representatives are keenly aware that Buddhism might perhaps be an unfinished project and that some of its doctrines should in fact be revised to take into account the findings of cognitive science. In the first part of the book, Flanagan offers a blueprint for how this revisionary process might unfold, as well as what it would entail: abandoning the notion of rebirth, striving for more conceptual clarity, conceding that all mental states have neural correlates, and framing a neo-compatibilist account of the relation between freedom and responsibility.

Are Buddhists happier that the rest of us, and is this happinessBuddha in any way different from, say, happinessNorth Atlantic Liberal 21st Century or being-in-a-good-moodAmerican? Furthermore, how does this happiness differ (as it must) from the sense of well-being that comes from doing the right thing, or from having successfully cultivated virtues such as courage, forbearance, or compassion? Most importantly, what is flourishing, Buddhist style, and what would become of the Buddhist account of how such flourishing is achieved if this practical philosophy of enlightenment were to be naturalized? By venturing answers to these and many related questions Flanagan gives us "a work of advocacy for something that doesn't yet have any traction, at most a tenuous foothold" (4) but that he thinks ought to exist, namely "Buddhism naturalized": a Buddhism that is compatible with neurophysicalism (the view that mental states and brain states are in fact identical) and is conceived as a "eudaimonistic virtue theory" (143).

Flanagan is less concerned, it seems, with what the traditional Buddhist way of life feels like first-personally, and more with what a socially engaged, psychologically savvy Buddhism without beliefs has to offer those who think that science gives the only answers worth considering about the origins, development, and function of human affect and cognition. Along the way, Flanagan advances an alternative and, by his own admission, highly opinionated, anachronistic, and ethnocentric reading of Buddhist philosophy that is free of what he takes to be the "arcane, superstitious, and metaphysically muddled religion or philosophy" (117) one encounters in presentations of Buddhism by Western philosophers. One might wonder who exactly these philosophers are, since with the exception of those few Western philosophers who are also eminent scholars of Buddhist philosophy, and on whose work Flanagan heavily relies (Jay Garfield and Mark Siderits, among others, come to mind), the vast majority of those writing on Buddhist philosophy are religious-studies scholars, cultural historians, and philologists.

Of course, Flanagan is aware that most of what goes on in the name of Buddhist philosophy today is a new form of scholasticism, where exegesis typically trumps philosophical argument, and reverence for tradition and its representative figures take the place of critical reflection. But he should have done more to foreground contributions that are philosophically rigorous from other kinds of engagement with the Buddhist tradition. He does cite a few relevant authoritative texts (The Middle Length and Long Discourses of the Buddha, Nāgārjuna's Verses on the Heart of the Middle Way, and Śāntideva's The Way of the Bodhisattva) as well as seminal works of Buddhist scholarship. But his main interlocutors seem to be the Dalai Lama and those who, like him, worry that naturalism strips Buddhism (and Buddhist phenomenology in particular) of its claim that it can offer an account of what it is like to see the mind clearly and to analyze its contents accurately.

Most of the book is dedicated to showing, step by step, how a Buddhist metaphysics of morals actually evolves from the embodied patterns of conduct that characterize the Buddhist way of being-in-the-world. As Flanagan rightly observes, being in certain states of mind such as calmness and serenity might dispose one to be more caring toward others, but those feelings are not constitutive of what it means to have (or have embodied) equanimity (upekha) (108). Rather, equanimity is constitutive of a certain way of being-in-the-world that reflects the ethos of the bodhisattva (whose boundless compassion for all sentient beings is anchored in an enlightened perspective about the nature of things); it is not the product of naturally occurring states of mind.

This observation seems to answer, at least in part, one specific question about the epistemic role that phenomenology (including Buddhist phenomenology) plays vis-à-vis the project of naturalism: studied and methodical descriptions of experience do reveal something universal about what certain mental states are like. Indeed, Flanagan is inclined to concede that phenomenology might actually work as a reliable method for the descriptive analysis of experience. But, he asks, "Does phenomenology reveal anything more . . . than how the mind seems first-personally?" (81) For the naturalist the answer is obvious: phenomenology cannot reveal to us certain hard facts about the nature and function of cognition; for instance, that color perception is mostly foveal or that, due to the lack of light-detecting photoreceptor cells on the optic disc of the retina where the optic nerve passes through, there is a blind spot in a certain region of our perceptual field.

For proponents of the view that the mind is best studied by a combination of first- and third-person methods, however, such findings are both empirically relevant and phenomenologically constraining. Although we have known about the existence of the blind spot since 1666, when it was first discovered by the French Roman Catholic priest and scientist Edme Mariotte, it is only relatively recently, and as a result of careful phenomenological observation, that we have identified the phenomenon of perceptual completion. As a phenomenon, perceptual completion doesn't just mask the blind spot; it also reveals that one's perceptual field has a specific intentional structure. And this intentional structure has not been found, as yet, to be reducible. Flanagan, however, takes issue with the Buddhist claim that there might be aspects of the mind that are not reducible to their neural correlates. He sees such a claim, which the Dalai Lama in effect has made on several occasions, as tantamount to endorsing some kind of substance dualism. Nevertheless, he does concede that on a more charitable reading the Dalai Lama might simply be resisting the reductive move, rather than claiming that there aren't any neural correlates for some specific states of mind (such as those of pure awareness).

Furthermore, claims of this sort, we are told, are nothing but ancillary beliefs internal to Buddhism that lack any argument or justification (85). But such curt assessment as Flanagan advances does no justice to the rich tradition of philosophical debate in Buddhism between proponents of the reflective or other-illumination conception of consciousness and those who defend the view that the mind is naturally self-illuminating. For the first group, which includes philosophers of the Madhyamaka ("Middle Way") school of thought, but also Naiyāyikas ("philosophical logicians"), self-awareness is the product of a second-order cognition that takes the first cognition as its object, a view akin to higher order representationalist views of consciousness such as have been defended by D. M. Armstrong, W. G. Lycan, and David Rosenthal. The second group takes consciousness to be inherently self-revealing, and includes the Yogācāra ("Practice of Yoga") philosophers, the Buddhist epistemologists, most of the major thinkers in the Western phenomenological tradition, and a growing number of contemporary analytic philosophers. Far from lacking in argument, the self-luminosity view of consciousness has been vigorously debated and defended by Buddhist philosophers (and it is on this tradition of debate that the Dalai Lama rests his claim). Experience, claims the Buddhist reflexivist who follows Dharmakīrti's account of consciousness, fundamentally involves the simultaneous awareness of an object and of its first-personal mode of givenness. Otherwise, object-cognition without self-cognition and self-cognition without object-cognition would be indistinguishable. Contemporary philosophers have defended variants of this position, but one is not going to learn about its long pedigree in the Buddhist philosophical literature from Flanagan's book.

This point of criticism should not detract from the fact that the book does deliver on its promise of offering, under the guise of comparative neurophilosophy, a "philosophical theory that is worthy of attention by analytic philosophers" (3). The project of naturalizing Buddhism, it seems, accomplishes this aim by offering, first, an account of Buddhist philosophy that is scientifically informed and, second, a cautionary tale about why brain science alone cannot reveal the causes and constituents of human flourishing. Those who are skeptical that Buddhism has anything to contribute to current debates in philosophy might become more responsive if they were to learn, for instance, that Abhidharma -- a large body of literature concerned with examining the doctrinal foundations of Buddhism -- is essentially a "masterpiece of phenomenology, an early exercise in analytic existentialism . . . and . . . arguably the best taxonomy of conscious-mental-state types ever produced" (104). Flanagan is to be commended for making a strong and compelling case for why such a comprehensive taxonomy of the mental domain is deserving of more attention from philosophers.

Throughout the book one often comes across statements to the effect that "Buddhism is a distinctive normative theory" (20) or that "Buddhist psychology is overly normative" (103), which I take it are meant to serve as reminders that we are dealing here with a well-developed account of moral psychology. Critics might argue that categorizing mental states into wholesome and unwholesome blurs the distinction between psychology and ethics. Flanagan offers a principled answer: if normativity works for psychiatry, abnormal psychology, and structural engineering (the latter's principles allow us, after all, to build bridges and buildings that last) (104), why not for Buddhist psychology, given its overriding concerns with identifying and countering unwholesome mental states, and cultivating wholesome ones.

It is primarily this synthesis of normativity and causal explanation that makes Buddhism special. If for Aristotelian flourishing comes from living a life of virtue (understood as human reason embodied), Buddhist moral concerns and aspirations for freedom are informed by such metaphysical principles as the no-self view (which Flanagan interprets in terms of psychological continuity and connectedness), the impermanence of all phenomena, and interdependent arising. EudaimoniaBuddha and eudaimoniaAristotle are different, though perhaps complementary, experiments in living. By stressing the difference between these and many other ways of being-in-the-world, Flanagan is not championing the sort of ethical relativism one typically associates with Gilbert Harman or David B. Wong. Rather, he hopes to launch an inquiry and invite a new way of philosophizing that moves beyond comparative approaches, which seeks to locate points of convergence and contrast between different theories in the hope of casting each one in sharper relief. It also claims to encompass the fusion approach to philosophy, championed by Mark Siderits and consisting in the mixing and matching of philosophical ideas with the aim of identifying and (hopefully) solving genuinely universal problems. Flanagan calls his new mode of doing philosophy "cosmopolitan" and describes it as "the exercise of reading and living and speaking across different traditions" in a way that is "open, non-committal, and energized by an ironic or skeptical attitude about all the forms of life being expressed" (2). Such an approach, claims Flanagan, allows one to ask the sort of questions that other approaches would seldom entertain: Which ways of thinking and being and living are better or worse than others? And, if some are better or at least as comprehensive as others, ought they not to receive more attention from philosophers than they hitherto have?

For Flanagan comparative neurophilosophy, an outline and defense of which is offered in the first part of the book, conclusively demonstrates that Buddhism has something valuable to offer philosophers working at the intersection of moral psychology, phenomenology, and metaethics. In the second part of the book, aptly titled "Buddhism as natural philosophy," Flanagan explains why Buddhism should be so appealing to philosophers. It offers a metaphysics anchored in such robust principles as impermanence, no-self, and the ubiquity of causation, an epistemology that is thoroughly empiricist, and an ethics that prizes compassion, while at the same time claiming "that there are logical connections between these three" (206). A philosopher working at the intersection of multiple "spaces of meaning" would find that these logical connections open up new possibilities for enhancing, refining, and expanding the range of philosophical arguments and possibilities.

The Bodhisattva's Brain is an engaging and intellectually daring foray into cross-cultural philosophy, despite occasionally (and ironically for a work that makes a plea against armchair philosophizing) slipping into the sort of presumptive argumentation typical of over generalized treatments of Buddhist philosophy. Even so, the book will most likely win praise among contemporary philosophers, Buddhist scholars, and cognitive scientists alike for its bold and uncompromising stance on what is and is not worth keeping of this venerable tradition of philosophical inquiry, moral cultivation, and existential transformation.