The Body as Object and Instrument of Knowledge: Embodied Empiricism in Early Modern Science

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Charles T. Wolfe and Ofer Gal (eds.), The Body as Object and Instrument of Knowledge: Embodied Empiricism in Early Modern Science, Springer, 2010, 349pp., $189.00 (hbk), ISBN 9789048136858.

Reviewed by Anita Guerrini, Oregon State University


"Embodied empiricism," according to Charles Wolfe and Ofer Gal, refers to "the keen interest in the body as both an object of research and an instrument of experience" in the early modern era (p. 2). This interest, they claim, has been largely overlooked by modern historians, and the fifteen essays in this volume are an attempt to redress this gap in the historiography. Written by a mix of junior and more senior scholars, these essays originated at a conference at the University of Sydney in 2009 and focus on one of three themes: the body as an object of inquiry, the body as an instrument of empirical knowledge, and what the editors call "embodied cognition," or consideration of the mind as a part of the body.

Wolfe and Gal assert that the study of empiricism has been separated from its "patent indebtedness" to the sciences of the body, which include medicine, physiology, and natural history, but also chemistry (p. 2). If nothing else, this very diverse collection of essays demonstrates that "embodiment" is a slippery and amorphous category, and for the editors of this volume it is more philosophical than historical.

The first section on the body as object of inquiry continues and in some cases extends historical work from the past two decades that has inserted the sciences of life into the narrative of early modern science. Hal Cook has been a leader in this historiography and it is fitting that the volume should open with his essay, which reasserts his arguments on the role of medicine and therapeutics in the development of an empirical frame of mind in the seventeenth century. His characterization of William Harvey as fundamentally conservative (and, in a rather odd digression, as a crypto-Catholic) certainly conforms to a standard view of Harvey's politics and therapeutics, but downplays the radical epistemological claims he made in De motu cordis -- that non-causal observation could constitute knowledge -- which were the focus of his debates with Jean Riolan. On the other hand, Cook's excellent exploration of Descartes's empiricism adds much to the ongoing reevaluation of his thought.

Cynthia Klestinec's essay continues her exploration of anatomical teaching at Padua but partially shifts her focus from Harvey's teacher Girolamo Fabrici. Considering anatomy from the student's point of view, and making good use of student notes, she carefully distinguishes the various kinds of anatomy teaching at the end of the sixteenth century and the beginning of the seventeenth: private lectures emphasized expertise, while Fabrici's public lectures connected anatomy to natural philosophy. She notes a tradition of learned surgery which contrasts with the usual view of surgeons as uneducated artisans.

Alan Salter returns to Harvey to argue that the writing of De motu cordis was only possible because a "discourse of the senses" developed in the second half of the sixteenth century in English literature. However, he seems unaware of a number of recent publications on science, language, and literature, including Richard Sugg's Murder after Death (2007), which are directly relevant to his theme.

Victor Boantza also overreaches in his essay when he claims that the chemical researches of Samuel Cottereau Duclos were the most important activities of the early Paris Academy of Sciences. Boantza bases this estimation largely on the number of pages that Duclos occupied in the proc├Ęs-verbaux of the Academy. But most of these pages -- which were indeed considerable -- consisted not of experimental work but of Duclos's very long lectures on works by Boyle and van Helmont. The final essay in this section on "The Body as Object" is Peter Anstey's very fine reappraisal of John Locke's medical ideas, in which he convincingly identifies him as a Helmontian chymical physician. However, it is not entirely clear how these two last essays fit the overall theme of the section of the body as an object of inquiry.

"The Body as Instrument" includes five essays which define "instrument" in a variety of ways. The first essay by Ofer Gal and Raz Chen-Morris argues that the telescope not only enhanced the senses but also displaced human senses to the lower category of an instrument itself in need of correction. Their argument, centered on Galileo and Kepler, reveals the epistemological consequences of the new optical instruments. Guido Giglioni takes an entirely different tack in his analysis of Francis Bacon's theory of "material appetites" in Sylva sylvarum. His assertion that men's appetites and not their knowledge was their essential attribute casts Bacon's scientific thought in a new light, but again the connection to the theme of the section is not apparent. This is not the case with the entertaining essay of Justin E.H. Smith, who begins with Bacon but then turns to the work of the (rather obscure) Baconian John Bulwer on chiromancy and gesture. However, Smith does not compare this work to that of contemporaries such as Marin Cureau de la Chambre, who wrote on chiromancy in the 1640s, so the reader gets little sense of the broader context.

Richard Yeo too remains in England in his exploration of the role of memory in organizing the influx of empirical data the new philosophy afforded. Yeo's fine essay contrasts Robert Boyle's suspicion of systems, even memory systems, with the classical memory system of the natural philosopher John Beale, providing an interesting extension of Ann Blair's work on note-taking and classification. The final essay in this section shifts from the seventeenth to the late eighteenth century with an examination of Jean-Baptiste Lamarck's notions of "sentimens" or feelings. Snait Gissis disentangles a theory of the relationship between empiricism and feelings -- between observation and the mental experience of it -- from Lamarck's voluminous works. But her densely argued essay may impose more consistency on Lamarck's thought than is warranted.

The third section, on "embodied minds," is both more unified and more philosophical than the previous sections. It begins with John Sutton's wonderful essay on the physiology of mind-wandering: how did moral philosophers explain daydreaming and other apparently involuntary acts of thought? Beginning with Locke and ending with Hume, Sutton explores the mind-body connection in the work of several British moral philosophers and physicians of the early eighteenth century. Lisa Shapiro also examines Locke in her closely argued essay on his account of experience, which she separates into two that she calls an instrumental and an immersed model. She asserts that there is a tension in Locke's idea of sense experience as a simple importation of information and a more complex notion in which bodily conditions such as pleasure and pain affect these experiences.

Anik Waldow begins her essay with Kant's critique of empiricism and then turns to Galen's much different use of that concept. The ancient debate between empirical and dogmatic practitioners is familiar to historians of medicine, but here Waldow examines Galen's empiricism from a philosophical point of view and finds in it the roots of skepticism. The final two essays bring the story to the mid-eighteenth century. Tobias Cheung examines the body-soul interface and the multiple meanings of "sensation" in his essay on the "human statue" in Condillac and Bonnet. While Condillac was mainly concerned with the transformation of sensation into thought, Bonnet developed a complex physiological system based on fibers to explain how external stimuli became bodily sensations. Cheung's excellent account reveals a key moment in the exploration of the mind-body divide.

Charles Wolfe's closing essay attempts to sum up the volume as a whole -- not an easy task with such a diverse set of essays -- by focusing on the distinctiveness of medical empiricism. He opposes this medical empiricism, which he identifies as vitalist, to the experimental empiricism of the Royal Society as well as to the philosophical empiricism of Locke and Hume. Wolfe wishes to rehabilitate vitalism from what he calls "the stupid person's view" (p. 336) of an emphasis on non-mechanical vital forces to a kind of Hippocratic emphasis on observing and not intervening. By coupling mechanism with experimentation, Wolfe wishes to establish a new divide between mechanism and vitalism, in which vitalism is the model for an empirical science of life and a new way of looking at early modern science. I expect he is being deliberately provocative here, but this simply will not do. Experimentation cannot simply be shunted to one side, and he has to admit that Harvey fits this model of an anti-experimentalist rather badly, but he nonetheless makes the claim that Harvey is part of a "sustained anti-experimentalist line of argument" (p. 333).

The goal of The Body as Object and Instrument of Knowledge of providing an alternate narrative of early modern science is incompletely realized. Perhaps it is an impossible task, particularly within the boundaries of an edited volume. The ill-defined category of "embodiment" is part of the problem. It overshadows some essays and seems irrelevant to others. The organizing principles behind the three categories remain obscure; why is chemistry an example of the body as object of inquiry, and how is Galen's distinction between empiricism and dogmatism an example of the embodied mind? Despite the sniping in the introduction and conclusion against the Boyle/Royal Society narrative of early modern science, this new narrative is largely Anglocentric, with seven of the fifteen essays devoted to England. The chronological breadth of the volume is also problematic. Temporal breadth is not a bad thing, but this volume is split between the early-to-mid seventeenth century and the mid-to-late eighteenth century with little connecting material. Few of the essays, moreover, speak to each other. The result is a volume with a few very good essays that contributes to the ongoing redefinition of what we used to call the Scientific Revolution, but which is not the game-changer it claims to be.