The Cambridge Companion to Abelard

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Jeffrey Brower and Kevin Guilfoy (eds.), The Cambridge Companion to Abelard, Cambridge University Press, 2004, 382pp, $24.99 (pbk), ISBN 0521775965

Reviewed by Martin Tweedale , University of Alberta


With the possible exception of Thomas Aquinas, no scholastic of the western medieval period is better known outside of scholarly circles than Peter Abelard (1079 – 1142). But this fame, in contrast to Aquinas’s, is mostly due to the very romantic story of his life, preserved for us in his own autobiographical Historia Calamitatum and a set of letters exchanged between him and his wife Heloise. Within scholarly circles, on the other hand, it is well known that Abelard was an extremely original thinker in both logic and theology, who merits a high place in the pantheon of medieval scholastics on the basis of that work alone. The volume under review concentrates on this latter while also being very informative about the probable course of Abelard’s tempestuous career and reviewing some of his literary accomplishments. There is much here that the lay person untutored in the conceptual apparatus of scholastic theology and philosophy can profit from, but a number of the articles become quite technical and will be useful mainly to those already fairly expert in the field. The authors of the various chapters, there are ten altogether, certainly do not shy away from giving their own views on controversial areas of Abelardian interpretation, of which there are many. The end result, I think, presents Abelard’s work as eminently worth studying by philosopher and theologian alike, and something whose interpretation on many topics is far from settled.

Most of the scholars who have contributed chapters have been writing about Abelard and 12th-century thought for a long time; they are John Marenbom, author in 1997 of a book covering the whole of Abelard’s philosophy, Yukio Iwakuma, who has done excellent work sorting out the various schools extant in Abelard’s time, Klaus Jacobi, one of the most subtle interpreters of Abelard’s logic, Peter King, whose Princeton PhD thesis helped spark the current interest in Abelard, William E. Mann, known for work in the philosophy of religion, Christopher Martin, who has written extensively on Boethian logic, and Winthrop Wetherbee, who is an expert in medieval literature. The newer faces are Thomas Williams, who edited the Cambridge Companion to Duns Scotus, and the two editors of this volume, Jeffrey Brower and Kevin Guilfoy. One could hardly wish for a more competent crew.

The reader of the volume will find in Professor Marenbom’s piece a summary of the state of the argument among scholars as to the temporal ordering of Abelard’s works. Among the most important results is that the majority of scholars now seem to favor the view that the Dialectica, Abelard’s compendium on logic, was an early work, earlier than the so-called Logica Ingredientibus, which takes the form of a commentary on the books of the logica vetus, and that what used to be called the Logica ’nostrorum petitioni sociorum’ is later still. Klaus Jacobi backs up this judgment in section I.1 of his piece on the philosophy of language. Since in many ways the Logica Ingredientibus strikes the reader as more sophisticated than the Dialectica, it is comforting to know that the latter need not be thought of as closer to Abelard’s final words on logical problems.

The editors are to be congratulated for including ample discussion of the theological component of Abelard’s work as well as Professor Wetherbee’s informative and judicious critique of the Historia and Abelard’s poetic oeuvres, which evidently have considerable artistic merit. Coupling this with Professor Marenbom’s concise biography, we get a picture of Abelard as a complex man torn between academic ambition and commitment to his faith. In the latter half of his life (i.e., the half after the catastrophic end of his romance with Heloise) he tries to weld these two impulses into the production of a rational exposition of the dogmas of the faith which he could teach in the schools of Paris and elsewhere. Students seem to have loved it, but many of his contemporaries in the church hierarchy were offended and twice had his theological work condemned.

One of the topics that led Abelard into trouble was the doctrine of the atonement, and Thomas Williams in his chapter entitled “Sin, grace, and redemption” gives us a very balanced interpretation of Abelard’s theory of this central dogma. The theory is not nearly as liberated from the bizarre doctrines of medieval Catholicism as some have claimed (there is still the doctrine that all humans start life in the position of facing divine retribution for some sin committed by the original pair in the Garden of Eden), but it does emphasize that the goal is to renounce sin not because of the fear of this retribution but out of love of God. Williams does not entirely declare Abelard innocent of Pelagianism, one of the reasons his work was condemned, but the Pelagianism Abelard adopts is by modern lights so totally reasonable that, if his opponents denied it, one can only conclude that they convicted themselves of believing what is hopelessly irreconcilable with a just God.

Also firmly within the scope of theology is Abelard’s work on ethics, for what he deals with, for the most part, is the definition of sin, although many related topics are aired. Prof. Mann analyses in detail the content of Abelard’s treatise, Scito te ipsum, noting as he goes the various problems that arise for Abelard’s idea that sin in the strict sense consists solely in consenting to do what we believe offends God. If we substitute ’is morally prohibited’ for ’offends God’, we have a modern subjectivist view of how a person makes him or herself morally reprehensible. In his discussion Mann doesn’t let Abelard get away with much, and he is fully aware that the view is not a criterion for the moral badness of an action or even moral culpability; in the latter cases objective criteria of right and wrong have a place. Mann’s piece is very stimulating philosophically since it invites one to think through the interesting cases that pose problems for Abelard’s theory.

When we come to the dogma of the Trinity we enter an area where theology and logic get intertwined. Jeffrey Brower’s chapter on this topic is a very clearly written attempt to explain how Abelard tried to explicate the doctrine by developing a very sophisticated theory of identity which would allow him to fully affirm that the three divine Persons are the same as the Divine Essence and as each other and yet differ in some important and objective way. After explaining that for Abelard the essential or numerical sameness of items does not entail that they are indiscernible, i.e., that whatever is true of one is true of the other, and thus that Abelard’s “essential sameness” is not the same as our logical notion of identity, he launches into what Abelard can mean by “distinct in definition” and “distinct in property”. The Persons turn out to be distinct in definition (e.g., what it is to be the Father does not involve what it is to be the Son, and vice versa) but they are also distinct in property, or at least in what is “proper”, i.e., distinctive, in that the Son is begotten but the Father is not, while the Father begets but the Son does not. Abelard claims that there is an analogy here with the way the wax of a waxen image and the image itself are essentially and numerically the same, but are distinct in definition, since what it is to be wax does not involve what it is to be an image, and distinct in property, since the wax is prior to the image but the image is not prior to itself or to the wax.

The same examples are covered more briefly but no less carefully in section III of Peter King’s chapter on Abelard’s metaphysics. Brower, however, claims to find a difference in Abelard between being distinct in property and being distinct in what is proper, while King notes no such difference and never mentions the latter. Brower has taken to heart, perhaps too much, the urgency with which Abelard denies that the distinctness in property among the Persons entails some violation of the divine simplicity. Abelard realizes that he must deny that there is any multiplicity of things in God, and fearing that properties might be taken to be things, he denies that they are any “forms” in God, rather they are just what is proper (i.e., distinctive) in God. My own reading of Abelard is that he never intends a property to be a form or any sort of thing; rather it is a sort of status, and he always says that status are nothing; hence there is no real reason to distinguish out another form of distinction in the way Brower does. But this leads into the whole discussion surrounding universals, which is a topic for several of the contributors to this book.

Abelard has long been famous for his quarrel with William of Champeaux about the ontological status of species, genera, and the other types of universals. As is well known, Abelard adopted the view that they were all linguistic, calling them utterances (voces) at one point in his career, and words (sermones) at another point. (The relation between utterances and words is itself an interesting topic that provides another opportunity for Abelard to use his theory of sameness and distinctness.) William had thought universals were odd things that could simultaneously be the “material essence” of many distinct particulars. The theory is described both by King and by Iwakuma, but King goes into considerable detail about Abelard’s critique. The chief argument here is one in which Abelard tries to show that it is a consequence of William’s view that a particular ass, named Brunellus, will be the same as Socrates, and the crucial move in that argument is to show that the combination of the “material essence” in Brunellus with the forms which differentiate that essence cannot be Brunellus. I did not find King’s interpretation of this bit of the argument entirely satisfying, and it appears the exegesis here remains controversial.

As for Abelard’s own positive view, Marenbom situates Abelard’s claim that universals are utterances in the context of earlier attempts to read Aristotle’s Categories as about utterances rather than things. That work becomes a linguistic treatise rather than an ontological one. Marenbom believes it would be unwarranted to assume that these earlier writers, notably Garlandus of Besancon, had taken the position that nothing in non-linguistic reality is universal. I find this hard to believe. These writers worked within the tradition which treats universals as just whatever it is that is characterized as a species or genus or difference or property or accident, and it is clear that they took all these terms to refer to utterances.

Certainly, however, both Marenbom and King are correct to say that Abelard holds that nothing apart from words is universal, but rather every thing is particular. But according to King this turns out not to be the beginning of a vast reductive program; rather we find that there are all sorts of particulars besides the obvious concrete substances. There are substantial forms and accidental forms, where the former amount to organizations of material parts (and ultimately of the atoms from which the whole material realm is made). King seems to think that Abelard has accidental forms for qualities, quantities and even relations. Abelard’s natures, too, are not, according to King, “anything in addition to the substantial form and attributes of the individual.” Obviously, on King’s reading Abelard has not embarked on a radical program of ontological parsimony in the way Ockham would be a couple centuries later.

King even thinks that Abelard has a sort of realist view of natural kinds. He says (p.82) that for Abelard “they are no more than discrete integral wholes whose principle of membership is similarity…” Abelard’s occasional references to status, like that of being a human, as what unites individuals into a class, is said to be a shorthand “that carries no metaphysical baggage.” The division into natural kinds, King says, is a “shallow fact”; God could have ordained fire to be cold, heavy bodies to fall upwards and frogs to reason. (p.83) Nevertheless, according to King, Abelard’s view ties the kind of thing a thing is closely to what it is able to do. I am a little puzzled as to how all this fits together, but it certainly is a definite stand on what Abelard is up to in ontology.

King also holds that Abelard thinks events and states of affairs are not things in the world, just as dicta, i.e., what sentences say, are not things. Nothing is an event, nothing is a state of affairs, and nothing is what a sentence says. This of course does not mean that no sentence says anything, or that events don’t happen, or dicta are never true. Abelard’s “irrealism”, as King terms it, is an odd doctrine, whose coherence is going to be a continuing point of dispute. In any event, surely this irrealism is at the root of what is going on in the defense of divine simplicity which Brower describes. The point must be that God’s having different properties does not entail that there are different things in God. There is nothing which is God’s wisdom. The question arises whether the same can be said of Socrates’ wisdom, so that it too is no form or thing in Socrates. If the answer is yes, then one wonders about King’s attribution of such ontological profligacy to our hero.

Another item that gets the “irrealist” treatment are the ficta or images which the mind throws up in the course of its thought to represent what it is thinking of. Kevin Guilfoy has much to say on the connection or lack of it between the image and the content of a thought and claims that Abelard gives two somewhat conflicting views. In one view he holds that the image has got to display just the features which what we are thinking of has; in the other view the features of the image are much less important than what the mind attends to when it forms the image. In either case, the image is nothing, according to Abelard, but that doesn’t stop him from saying the mind creates it.

Klaus Jacobi’s piece also touches on status and dicta in the course of a very informative discussion of Abelard’s semantic theory. It makes what may be an important contribution to sorting out the real thought behind Abelard’s irrealism when it notes Abelard’s recognition that there are propositions which do not logically speaking have a subject and a predicate. In the terminology of the day they were called impersonal. They do not have the form of something being said of something, so beloved by the Aristotelians. Abelard takes it that modal propositions taken in the “composite sense” are impersonal. This includes a sentence like ’It is true that the sky is blue’. Abelard resists the idea that with this sentence we are predicating truth of something, namely of the dictum of the proposition, ’The sky is blue’. Despite its grammar the modal sentence does not have subject-predicate form logically speaking.

I wish to emphasize at this point that it is a strength, not a weakness, of this volume that the above topics get discussed differently by different authors. These are controversial and difficult issues of exegesis, and progress will be made only by examining them from different angles and with different takes on what Abelard’s program really amounts to.

Finally I want to mention the superb but very difficult chapter by Christopher Martin which deals with Abelard’s theory of inference and argumentation. Martin ably summarizes much of his own research on Abelard’s propositional logic and his theory of necessary consequences. He rightly credits Abelard with being the first medieval scholastic we know of to recognize that the propositional connectives can be thought of as propositional operators. This leads him to the modern notion of negation, something which is missing in both Aristotle and Boethius. This discovery alone is enough to put Abelard in the logic hall of fame.

Martin also treats the great controversy over what constitutes a true necessary consequence, what we might call an entailment. Abelard holds a view which demands that what the consequent says somehow be contained in the content of the antecedent, but this proves too strong, and a competing logician of the day, Alberic of Paris, seems to have invented an argument which showed it had untenable consequences. Martin explains all this in great detail in a long discussion that is not the easiest to follow. Yukio Iwakuma also deals with it in the final essay.

I hope the above gives some feel for the riches which are to be found in this volume for the student of medieval thought. The reader will also be assisted by a chronology of Abelard’s life, a list of his writings, a bibliography, and an index. Whoever is inspired by this companion to read Abelard himself, however, had better have a knowledge of Latin, for the overwhelming majority of Abelard’s works remain untranslated. What translations into English we have are mentioned in the list of Abelard’s writings.