The Cambridge Companion to Adorno

Placeholder book cover

Tom Huhn (ed.), The Cambridge Companion to Adorno, Cambridge University Press, 2004, 428pp, $26.99 (pbk), ISBN 0521775000.

Reviewed by Eduardo Mendieta, State University of New York, Stony Brook


Great thinking is always majestic and towering in its failure, as it speaks in signs and aphorism to an age echoing in the distance . Theodor W. Adorno (1903-1969) is one of those great thinkers beginning to be rescued and listened to as if for the first time, without the cacophony of his own time drowning the sounds of his philosophical music. 2003 marked the centenary of his birth and with it also came the conferences and congresses, and publication of a series of biographies[1], and bibliographical references, like the companion here under review. Dealing with Adorno's oeuvre is a truly daunting task, not merely because of its staggering size; presently we have the collected works in 20 volumes, made up actually of some 23 books, averaging 600 pages a book. In 1993 Suhrkamp Verlag began the publication of Adorno's Nachgelassene Schriften [Posthumous Works] in 30 volumes, made up of six sections, containing 17 volumes of lectures (some of which have been already translated) and 5 volumes of philosophical notebooks, in addition to numerous volumes of correspondence with Walter Benjamin, Max Horkheimer, Alban Berg, and his parents.

The amount of his output is matched only by the prodigiousness of the style. Adorno's works abounds inaphorisms, making almost every line quotable -- my undergraduate copy of the English translation of Negative Dialectics has almost every other line underlined. Only two other thinkers of the German language are comparable, Martin Heidegger and Ernst Bloch, although only in Adorno is the dialectic between language and thought suspended in such a way that the one does not become a handmaid of the other. In contrast to Heidegger's Teutonic boomings, Greco-Germanic archaism, and hackneyed etymologies, Adorno's style indulges neither imperial nostalgias nor consolations in the tune of angelic voices calling from the forests of time. In contrast to Bloch's eulogies to the German language and the cadences of spoken dialects, with their colloquialism and their endearment with pithy child-like philosophical ditties, Adorno's style rubs everyday language against the roughness of dialectical rigor, and the sounds of foreign words interspersed throughout make sure that language never forgets that its speaks in many tones and possibly thinks at the rhythm of other tunes. Adorno's style sobers, prickles, annoys; it is a cold splash of reason that refuses to be seduced by its own clarity. Adorno's thinking, however, knows that it must think in language, and this is at once its blessing and damnation It is also the type of thinking that is indebted to language, yet in its dependence, it realizes that the concept, enunciated in language, betrays that which its reaches out to grasp, returning thinking to the insufficiency of its endeavors. Adorno himself thought that "[p]hilosophy is essentially its language, philosophical problems are by and large problems of language, and the alleged independence of language from things that is found in the so-called positive sciences, does not apply in the same way for philosophy"[2]

In the English-speaking world, the complicity and promiscuous embrace between language and thought in Adorno's thinking has created understandable reticence to engage his work. The extant translations, dating from the sixties and seventies, have been denounced as wanting and even misleading. In 2002 Stanford University Press issued a new translation of The Dialectic of Enlightenment, and Robert Hullot-Kentor hadd already published in 1998 a new translation of Aesthetic Theory, to replace the one published in 1984 by Christian Lenhardt. He is also preparing a new translation of Negative Dialectics to replace the 1983 translation by E. B. Ashton. It is almost as if we are beginning to treat Adorno as if he were two millennia removed from us, and German had become a dead tongue. An equally important reason for Adorno's challenge is the breath of his overall contribution to the humanities and social sciences. His complete works contain studies on the authoritarian personality, the culture industry and mass culture, sociological treatises on music, numerous essays on sociological themes and concepts, reflections on Marxism, all of it woven with learned reconstructions of social theory, the history of philosophy with its terminologies, and brilliantly original readings of canonical figures. Adorno's work spans one of the most ghastly periods in recent history, and his thinking registered the horrors,

Still, one may safely aver that Adorno's work can be accessed in terms of its relationship and contribution to what has been called left Hegelianism, on the one hand, and historical materialism, on the other. Adorno is surely the most Hegelian of 20th century philosophers, in more ways than those who toiled with phenomenology, existentialism, pragmatism, and Nietzschean genealogy, were trying to come to terms with the fragments of an irreversibly shattered totality, but got caught in its shards and tangles. Reason can only be approached by way of conceptual ruin, and the ruins of the concept. If Hegelianism is about both totality and mediation, identity and difference, then Adorno was the most Hegelian of 20th century thinkers, who also, however, refused to embrace the Hegelian tale of ultimate reconciliation, or buy into the presupposed theodicy of the Golgotha of reason becoming freedom in history through endless suffering. If Geist, reason, is its history, this history remains a scar and no cauterization will conceal it under the smooth neoplasm of world-historical platitudes. Today, as Adorno said in so many ways, everything that is social and natural is thoroughly mediated, but the vehicle of the mediation is itself distorted by the "totality." There is no outside, only the mediated meditation, the trace of the whole in everything singular, and the singular as a monad that mirrors the whole. This mediated mediation, however, is always the commodity form. The concept itself has succumbed to the theological incantations of the circulation of wares and exchange values. The concept itself, as Luk‡cs had already shown in his History and Class Consciousness, and as Adorno never ceased to underscore, wore the scarlet letter of the market of commodities. For this reason, one may safely claim, that along with Fredric Jameson, Adorno was one of the great Marxist dialecticians of the 20th century.

With these claims, we have already anticipated how to begin to evaluate The Cambridge Companion to Adorno. Although the editor did an outstanding job of introducing the essays, and gathering a stellar group of scholars, the book fails as a unity . There are some truly outstanding contributions in this volume. J. M. Bernstein's and Simon Jarvis's soon to be canonical essays are gems of philosophical reflection that are first-rate contributions to Hegelian, Marxist, and Adornian scholarship. After Bernstein's essay it will be easier to understand how Adorno was an anti-Hegelian Hegelian, and how faithful Hegelians can only be so as anti-Hegelians. Jarvis's essay rightly draws the contours of Adorno's historical materialism, and elucidates the ways in which Adorno's philosophical system was a close commentary and explication of Marx's Grundrisse and Kapital. The essays by Christoph Menke and Gerhard SchweppenhŠuser explicate the ways in which Adorno contributed to the debate among Kant, Hegel, and Nietzsche on the relationship between freedom, morality, ethics, and justice, and how Adorno, therefore, should become a dialogue partner for second- and third-generation Critical Theorists as they study the nature of communicative freedom, dialogic solidarity, and substantive justice. The book is arguably weighted down by too many contributions on Adorno's work on the philosophy and sociology of the production and consumption of music. These essays, however, are also deformed by an eagerness to depict an Adorno in contradiction and aporia, an attitude more appropriate for scholarly journals and less so for tools of reference. James Schmidt's essay on Adorno's contributions to Thomas Mann's Doktor Faustus and his tortured relationship with Arnold Schoenberg is an important contribution to the intellectual history of a decisive period in Euro-American migrations and diasporas. It should be read as a preemptive answer to Robert Hullot-Kentor's mystifying contribution, which unfolds an utopian aspect of Adorno's work on the grounds of a disconcerting assumption, namely that Adorno's work should be doubly alienated from the United States, the country that always stands in his work as a metonym for totality and modernity, and has served as the very material condition of possibility of most of his work. In more than one way, Adorno's work was a meditation on America, and that there may be interest on his obtuse and hermetic work in the US should not be "puzzling," but both expectable and inevitable. In fact, Adorno may be needed more in the US than in Germany or Europe in general.

In addition to some of these shortcomings, the book fails to cover some significant territory in Adorno scholarship. Adorno's relationship to Benjamin is not substantively addressed, and this is a major oversight, especially as Adorno's work is so much a commentary on what is promised and left unresolved in Benjamin's mangled torso of a work. Another twin to Benjamin, Ernst Bloch, is only mentioned once, but not discussed at all. No justice is done to Adorno's Negative Dialectics if it is not read in tandem with Bloch's Principle of Hope and Subject-Object: Clarifications on Hegel. Bloch was also a philosopher of music, and philosopher of art, in general, who was always in Adorno's background, much like the tain of a mirror. Adorno's relationship to psychoanalysis and Freud should have received more attention, notwithstanding Joel Whitebook's essay, which should not have been included in this volume because it is less interested in engaging Adorno's work on its on terms than in pushing Whitebook's own intellectual project. It is simply not the case that Adorno was not aware of the ways in which sublimation does happen in and through the psycho-social mechanism of civilization. At the same time, however, and Adorno did not tire of making this point, sublimation must be both resisted and held in abeyance. This was the point of a negative dialectics that resists all attempts at reconciliation with a reified psychic life. Adorno's rupture with Erich Fromm, for instance, could have been a point of departure for an insight into what type of Freud Adorno and Horkheimer wanted to preserve. For both, the Freud of instincts and intractable corporeality, whose suffering and desiring remains un-sublateable and irreducible, became the alibi for a critique of consumer culture and the discontents of civilization. It is with reference to this Freud of tormented and tormentable bodies that Adorno developed his "negative morality," which refuses to reconcile Kant, or morality, and Hegel, or ethical life, because the moral imperative wells up as a somatic "impulse" and "stirring impatience" of the flesh. In general, a discussion of Adorno's type of Freudianism and how it stands athwart post-Lacanian psychoanalysis would have been most welcome.

Although there are two essays that deal with Adorno and Heidegger, their focus militates against a more thorough and synoptic overview of this antinomial duet. There was no contemporary thinker against whom Adorno thought most continuously, consistently, obsessively, and lastingly. Heidegger haunts almost every sentence in the Negative Dialectics, precisely because Adorno thought that Heidegger was usurping what he thought he himself was doing: overcoming metaphysics by its immanent destruction. The question of technology was not the only the issue that brought them into vicinity. Both thinkers dealt extensively with questions concerning the nature of the work of art, the role of language in thinking and philosophy, and both produced original readings of Hegel, Kant, and Nietzsche, among others.

Finally, an essay on Adorno's role as a public intellectual in Post-World War II Germany would have been very useful and would have allowed readers of the volume to access the impact, both beneficial and detrimental, to the development of West German political culture. The prejudice that Adorno was an elitist, disengaged from public culture, has begun to be refuted and dissolved by studies of the archives of the Institute for Social Research, and the publication of his extensive correspondence with colleagues, university officials, newspaper editors, and radio station directors[3]. These drawbacks notwithstanding, The Cambridge Companion to Adorno makes for a good point of entry into one of the most brilliant and capacious thinkers of the 20th century .

[1] See in particular Stefan MŸller-Doohm, Adorno: Eine Biographie (Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp Verlag, 2003), and Lorenz JŠger, Adorno: A Political Biography (New Haven, CT: Yale University Press, 2004).

[2] Theodor W. Adorno, Philosophische Terminologie, Vol 1 (Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp Verlag, 1973), 7.

[3] See Alex Demirovic, Der nonkoformistische Intellektuelle. Die Entwicklung der Kritischen Theorie zur Frankfurter Schule (Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp Verlag, 1999). See the thorough review essay by Max Pensky, "Beyond the Message in the Bottle: The Other Critical Theory" Constellations, Vol. 10, No. 1 (2003) 135-144. See also JŸrgen Habermas's essay on Adorno's centennial celebration, "Dual-Layered Time: Personal Notes on Philosopher T. W. Adorno in the '50's" Logos 2.4 (Fall 2003), available on-line at: