The Cambridge Companion to Arabic Philosophy

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Peter Adamson and Richard C. Taylor (eds.), The Cambridge Companion to Arabic Philosophy, Cambridge University Press, 2005, 468pp, $29.99 (pbk) ISBN 052152069X.

Reviewed by Jon McGinnis, University of Missouri, St. Louis


Philosophy written in Arabic in the Islamic world represents, perhaps, one of the last, if not only, great Western intellectual tradition left to receive serious philosophical attention by American and European scholars. That Arabic philosophy, until recently, has been understudied was due in part to the relative paucity of scholars who possessed both the required philological and philosophical tools necessary for such a serious study. Happily, within the last quarter century or so, a number of extremely competent scholars possessing the requisite linguistic and philosophical background have emerged. Peter Adamson and Richard C. Taylor have drawn on the talents of some of the best of these in The Cambridge Companion to Arabic Philosophy. The articles collected in this volume are of uniformly excellent quality, and the work is a must for any one working, or even interested, in the study of Arabic philosophy. Moreover, the work will be stimulating reading for students of Greek philosophy interested in seeing the later fruits of that tradition; Latin medievalists concerned with the historical precursors to scholasticism will greatly appreciate the insight that this volume offers into their own area of study; and finally anyone curious about the history of ideas in general will find this work both accessible and highly informative. In short, The Cambridge Companion to Arabic Philosophy is arguably the best reference book on Arabic philosophy available in English to date.

The work is conceptually divided into three sections: (1) the Greek philosophical background, as represented in the later Neoplatonic philosophical course curriculum and Graeco-Arabic translations, (2) studies of individual philosophers writing in Arabic and in the Islamic world, and (3) articles dedicated to specific philosophical topics germane to the study of Arabic philosophy. The first division is represented by Cristina D'Acona's "Greek into Arabic: Neoplatonism in translation". The subtitle, though, may have more aptly been "the Neoplatonic course curriculum into Arabic", since only a scant five pages are actually dedicated to Graeco-Arabic translations. Still her study provides a wonderful sketch of the philosophical background, which is remarkably useful for situating Arabic philosophy within the Greek intellectual tradition to which the Islamic world was heir.

The second section, on individual figures, includes papers on al-Kindi (Adamson), al-Farabi (Reisman), certain Isma'ilis (Walker), (namely, Muhammad an-Nasafi, Abu Hatim ar-Razi, Abu Ya'qub as-Sijistani, and Hamid ad-Din al-Kirmani), Avicenna (Wisnovsky), al-Ghazali (Marmura), Ibn Bajja (the Latin Avempace) and Ibn Tufayl (Montada), Averroes (Taylor), Suhrawardi (Walbridge) and the 'mystical philosophers' Ibn 'Arabi and Mulla Sadra (Rizvi). The articles of this section, while uniformly excellent, nonetheless vary in that some provide solid presentations of now 'standard interpretations' of certain figures (but in no case 'potted summaries'), while others literally represent the cutting edge of recent scholarship on an individual.

The final chapters of this volume treat various special topics in Arabic philosophy. Among these are logic (particularly Avicennan and post-Avicennan logical developments) (Street), ethical and political philosophy (Butterworth), natural philosophy (with an eye to the problems of the minima in the atomism of Islamic theologians and the related topic of the actual and potential infinite in Avicennan dynamics) (Rashed), psychology (Black), metaphysics (focusing especially on metaphysical analyses of causality) (Druart), medieval Jewish philosophy and its relation to Arabic philosophy (Harvey), the reception of Arabic philosophical thought into the Latin West (Burnett) and finally recent, i.e., post-Suhrawaridan or post-classical, trends in Arabic and Persian philosophy (Ziai). Like the earlier chapters, the scholarship of these papers is superb, and again the studies provide, in general, a nice mix of standard interpretations and cutting edge research. The one possible exception is Steven Harvey's piece on Arabic and Jewish philosophy, which, to this reader's mind, is dogged by the tired issue of defending a Straussian interpretation of Arabic and Jewish philosophy. In Harvey's defense, though, it should be noted that his position was one of the major trends in the study of Arabic philosophy in the not too distant past (and may be correct with respect to Jewish philosophy), although recently there appears to be a shift away from it at least with respect to the study of Arabic philosophy.

Finally, the volume has an excellent 'Select Bibliography and Further Reading' section at the end, which provides a general bibliography of works on Arabic philosophy as well as specific sections related to the topics covered in each article. This bibliography offers a relatively short list (roughly 15 pages) of additional books and articles that can direct the interested reader to more detailed treatments of issues covered in The Companion.

Certainly one of the great strengths of Adamson's and Taylor's Companion is its relatively compact nature, which is roughly 450 pages including index, and yet in this short space virtually the whole spectrum of Arabic philosophy is covered. In contrast, this page count should be compared with Nasr's and Leaman's History of Islamic Philosophy, which is a little over 1200 pages. Despite the fact that former is only slightly more than one-third the size of the latter, the two cover roughly the same period of time and topics, and in some cases the treatment of a subject in The Companion to Arabic Philosophy is more complete and authoritative than in the History of Islamic Philosophy, as is seen if one compares the chapters on Avicenna in the two works. That this work should have the breadth it has while maintaining a 'reader-friendly' size will almost assuredly make it the reference work of choice for students of Arabic philosophy.

Two very general observations, or caveats, should be made about The Cambridge Companion to Arabic Philosophy, neither of which necessarily should be construed as a negative criticism; nonetheless, they should be kept in mind when using this work. First, concerning the content of the majority of the articles, with a few notable exceptions most of the authors limit themselves to providing the historical background of the figure or issue addressed and an overview of the major conclusions, theses or topics at stake. In this respect, very few of the articles provide the historical arguments supporting a given philosophical position, let alone a detailed analysis of those arguments. There are notable exceptions to this general rule, such as Richard C. Taylor's rich article on Averroes, which includes not only a discussion of Averroes' historical background and major positions, but also indications of what led Averroes to his more novel theses. The reason for the relative paucity of detailed arguments is no doubt due to the exigencies of space. On average the chapters are approximately 23 pages, which includes notes (with Robert Wisnovsky's article on Avicenna rightly being given roughly double the amount of space). All of the chapters are packed with information useful for appreciating the historical, cultural and philosophical context and relevance of the philosopher or philosophical issue treated. Given what I anticipate will be the great success of The Cambridge Companion to Arabic Philosophy, one can only hope that Cambridge University Press will bring out further Companions dedicated to some of the more influential Arabic philosophers, such as Avicenna, in which case more space could be dedicated to deeper philosophical analyses of these philosophers' arguments.

Another observation is that a few, though not many, of the articles either fail to mention significant competing interpretations of a philosopher or philosophical issue, or simply relegate these opposing interpretations to a footnote. For instance, David C. Reisman's impressive article on al-Farabi never once mentions Muhsin Mahdi and his influential (even if by this reader's light wrong) Straussian reading of al-Farabi, even for the purposes of refuting it. The explanation in part may be, as I have already mentioned, that this issue is a tired one and the general trend in Arabic philosophy seems to be away from a Straussian paradigm. It may also be explained by the fact that the Straussian thesis is given more than ample space in Steven Harvey's contribution "Islamic Philosophy and Jewish Philosophy" and in Charles E. Butterworth's chapter on ethical and political philosophy in the medieval Arabic world. In this case, the editors should be lauded for their even-handedness in the allotment of space, even to an interpretation to which they themselves do not subscribe. Another instance of passing over an opposing interpretation is Michael E. Marmura's contribution on al-Ghazali, which does not mention Richard Frank's, and other's, competing reading of Ghazali's theory of causation except in passing within a footnote. The debate between Marmura and Frank concerns whether Ghazali was an occasionalist who denied causal efficacy of anything other than God (Marmura's thesis) or whether he allowed for limited causality among created things (Frank's thesis). The absence of this debate in part might be because Marmura has, perhaps, taken the day on this issue -- which seems to be the opinion of the majority of Ghazali scholars, though by no means all -- and again in part because the limited space allotted to each article simply precluded presenting the detailed intricacies of this debate.

These observations, again though, should not distract one from appreciating the uniformly excellent quality of virtually every article in this collection and the praiseworthy efforts of the editors in bringing together so many fine scholars in this work. One hopes that my comments will encourage readers to take advantage of the select bibliography at the end of the volume to learn more about Arabic philosophy.