The Cambridge Companion to Brentano

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Dale Jacquette (ed.), The Cambridge Companion to Brentano, Cambridge University Press, 2004, 344pp, $24.00 (pbk) ISBN 0521007658.

Reviewed by Philip J. Bartok , St. John's College


Franz Brentano remains one of the most underappreciated figures in the development of twentieth century philosophy. Indeed, Brentano’s “invisibility” among contemporary analytic and continental philosophers has been a topic of much recent discussion and lament among Brentano scholars, some of whom have even gone so far as to propose a label for it (“The Brentano Puzzle”).1 While contemporary specialists in logic or ethics may enjoy some familiarity with Brentano’s contributions to their disciplines, mainstream analytic philosophers are likely to know of him primarily or even exclusively for his revival of the Aristotelian-Scholastic intentionality thesis, the thesis that all and only mental phenomena are characterized by a relation to or directedness upon an in-existent object. Yet the broader psychological project out of which this thesis arose, and the interpretive variants that it spawned among Brentano’s students remain for the most part little-known and poorly understood. Contemporary continental philosophers know of Brentano primarily as the “teacher of Husserl”. In this role, he is praised for having seen his way through to the intentionality of the mental but is criticized for having been unable to capitalize on the broader implications of this discovery for a truly phenomenological philosophy. Yet the extent of Brentano’s contributions, both substantive and methodological, to phenomenology is far wider than is typically supposed. As David Bell has recently argued, phenomenology’s Brentanian inheritance includes aspects of Brentano’s overall vision of philosophy’s nature, methods, and goals, as well as elements of his more specific doctrines concerning “phenomena, intuitions, presentations, judgments, consciousness, intentionality, meaning, language, logic, science, truth, certainty, evidence, and analysis”.2

Brentano’s philosophical and psychological studies formed the core of a broad school of Austrian philosophy, a school that employed a distinctive empiricist methodology in opposition to what Brentano and his followers took to be the metaphysical extravagances of nineteenth century German idealism and romanticism. Brentano insisted that the true approach to philosophy must be a “scientific” one, grounded in the self-evident data of immediate perception and committed to high ideals of clarity, precision, and conceptual rigor. Blending a deeply metaphysical orientation with the epistemological starting points of an empirical psychology, Brentano undertook ambitious descriptive examinations aimed at providing a rigorous grounding for “[l]ogic, aesthetics, ethics, pedagogy, politics, and practical dependence,” and gaining insights into “the question of immortality, the comprehension of God in analogy to the soul, [and] the concepts of cause and effect (ends and means).”3

The contributions to this impressive volume help to combat some of the currently reigning misperceptions about Brentano’s relationship to contemporary analytic philosophy, while filling in some of the lesser-known details concerning his relationship to Husserl and the phenomenological tradition. Beyond this, however, the volume reveals a thinker of surprising range and depth, one who made significant contributions to a wide variety of traditional metaphysical, logical, epistemological, ethical, psychological, and theological issues. The editor, Dale Jacquette, has assembled a solid collection of topically oriented essays that examine Brentano’s work in all of these areas. Appropriately, the intentionality thesis remains at the center of the discussion, and is explored in depth in five of the contributions and treated at least in passing in nearly all. In addition to the topically oriented essays that make up the bulk of the volume, three additional contributions explore the influences on Brentano’s thinking and his subsequent influence upon later thinkers.

The volume fills a significant and longstanding gap in the English-language literature on Brentano. With the exception of Victor Vellarde’s cursory On Brentano it is the only volume in English that even aims to survey Brentano’s philosophy as a whole.4 It must be admitted, however, that the volume is not one that will be accessible in all of its aspects to the generalist or to those approaching Brentano’s thought for the first time. Several of the essays are quite technical and take their bearings from scholarly disputes that will be obscure or of little interest to the non-specialist. That said, the essays by Jacquette, Kevin Mulligan, Charles Parsons, Wilhelm Baumgartner and Lynn Pasquerella, and Susan Krantz Gabriel are among the most accessible.

Jacquette’s centerpiece essay on “Brentano’s concept of intentionality” provides a fine starting point for those new to Brentano, and especially for those whose familiarity with his work does not extend beyond his intentionality thesis. The contributions by Arkadiusz Chrudzimski and Barry Smith, Kevin Mulligan, Joseph Margolis, and Linda McAlister provide further discussion of the intentionality thesis and the interpretive difficulties it presents. Jacquette nimbly navigates the interpretive thickets surrounding the early version of the thesis that Brentano presents in his 1874 Psychology from an Empirical Standpoint. Jacquette rightly emphasizes that by intentional in-existence of an object, Brentano means here the literal containment of the intended object within the intending act (as a part within a whole) and not, as is often supposed, the (possible or actual) non-existence of the intended object. Much of the essay is devoted to an exploration of the counterintuitive metaphysical consequences that arise if this thesis is taken seriously, and of the variants proposed by Höfler, Meinong, Twardowski, Husserl and in Brentano’s own post-1905 “reist” doctrine (the doctrine that only particular physical objects exist). Jacquette argues convincingly that it was precisely the metaphysical difficulties latent in Brentano’s early intentionality thesis that motivated his followers to undertake their own competing and in some cases highly fruitful investigations of intentionality.

In light of its problematic metaphysical consequences, it might be wondered why Brentano adopted his early immanentist reading of the intentionality thesis. Jacquette argues, correctly in my estimation, that Brentano’s descriptive psychological approach committed him to undertaking a study of the intentional character of mental acts that sought to sidestep metaphysical questions about the status of intentional objects. This is an important point that has often been missed by interpreters of Brentano’s intentionality thesis. Further, it is a point that can be fully appreciated only if the distinctive methodological character of Brentano’s descriptive psychological approach is understood (I shall say more about this below). In their contribution on Brentano’s ontology, Arkadiusz Chrudzimski and Barry Smith are unwilling to excuse this neglect of metaphysics and ontology. While they concede that Brentano may have intended at the time that his early intentionality thesis be read as devoid of ontological commitments, “[i]n light of the way Brentano’s analysis of intentionality developed after the Psychology … the reference to such immanent objects must be interpreted as signifying the introduction of a new ontological category with all ontological commitments that go together herewith” (205). Accordingly, the rest of their essay is devoted to an examination of what results if this ontologizing interpretation is taken seriously, both in the Psychology and in Brentano’s later reist works. In the end, they find themselves in agreement with Jacquette’s claim that no consistent metaphysics of intentional objects is to be found in Brentano’s early intentionality thesis.

Linda McAlister is more sanguine about the hopes for a consistent doctrine of intentionality in the Psychology. While she entitles her contribution “Brentano’s epistemology”, she devotes the bulk of her essay to the defense of a “Scholastic” reading of the intentionality thesis. According to this reading objects may be said to have two different modes of being or existence, actual existence or existence in the world, and intentional existence or existence in the mind. Like Anselm, for whom God literally exists both “in the mind” and extramentally, McAlister’s Brentano holds that everyday objects like horses enjoy extramental existence and, when perceived, thought about, or otherwise intended, a literal existence “in the mind”. McAlister’s reading has the virtue of taking seriously the Aristotelian and Scholastic roots of Brentano’s thesis. It must be admitted, however, that her reading introduces metaphysical problems of its own, among them issues surrounding the viability of the proposed temporary “doubling” of worldly objects when they are taken up as the objects of intending acts and the relations that would be required to hold between these two corresponding sets of objects.

Two additional essays help situate Brentano’s early intentionality thesis within his empirical psychology as a whole and examine further attempts to provide a coherent interpretation of this thesis. Kevin Mulligan’s essay, “Brentano on the mind”, locates Brentano’s discovery of the intentional character of mental phenomena within the context of his broader descriptive psychological examination of the mental realm. Brentano’s thesis is thereby revealed to be merely one among a number of descriptive psychological claims, all purportedly grounded in the immediate evidence of the faculty of inner perception. While this essay succeeds in revealing the range and fruitfulness of Brentano’s studies of mental phenomena, it offers only a cursory discussion of the descriptive psychological method itself, leaving it unclear how seriously the close analogy that Mulligan draws between descriptive psychology and contemporary philosophy of mind should be taken. Joseph Margolis’ rather disconnected “Reflections on intentionality” overlap somewhat with Jacquette’s essay, and with Schuhmann’s closing essay on Brentano’s impact on twentieth-century philosophy. Most helpful in Margolis’ essay is the section that deals with Chisholm’s interpretation of Brentano’s thesis, an interpretation that Margolis rightly insists is “strangely inapt” as a reading of Brentano and perhaps best read as a “very reasonable (alternative) account” (139, 140). Given the widespread acceptance among contemporary analytic philosophers of mind of the Chisholmian reading of Brentano’s thesis, this point deserves a more extended treatment than Margolis gives it here. Further, Margolis inexplicably resorts to Brentano’s later reist doctrines in criticizing Chisholm’s reading of the early intentionality thesis. This is an odd decision, given the differences between the early and later doctrines and the ample resources in Brentano’s Psychology for combating the Chisholmian misreading.

I have space here only to make brief mention of four additional topical essays devoted, respectively, to Brentano’s logic, his theory of judgment, and his contributions to value theory and philosophy of religion. Peter Simons’ overview of Brentano’s “simple but effective reforms” of elementary deductive logic emphasizes the continuing pedagogical usefulness of a Brentanian approach, built upon an existential theory of judgments and a set of simple inference rules capable of replacing standard syllogistic logic (64). Parsons’ essay on Brentano’s theories of judgment and truth offers a clear and thorough treatment of these theories against the background of Frege’s analysis of abstract thoughts and Russell’s theory of propositions. Wilhem Baumgartner and Lynn Pasquerella survey Brentano’s reistic theory of moral and aesthetic value, emphasizing his unlikely attempt to locate the origins of beauty and goodness in the intentional analogues of aesthetic and ethical emotions. Finally, Susan Krantz Gabriel’s contribution on “Brentano on religion and natural theology” situates his natural theology in the context of traditional cosmological proofs and emphasizes his surprisingly broad and deep knowledge of the sciences of his time, particularly Darwinism and thermodynamics.

While the volume’s topical essays provide a solid overview of the range of Brentano’s thought, those devoted to explorations of the influences on his thought and the significance of his doctrines for later thinkers are less successful. An essay by Rolf George and Glen Koehn on “Brentano’s relation to Aristotle” is the sole contribution devoted exclusively to a consideration of the sources of Brentano’s thinking. George and Koehn aim to tease out the Aristotelian roots of Brentano’s intentionality thesis and of his later reism. In opposition to those readers of Brentano who see him primarily as an appropriator of Aristotelian doctrines, they diagnose a “stubborn perseverance” in his attempts, guided by Aquinas, to bring an overall consistency to the Aristotelian corpus (35). While George and Koehn succeed in highlighting some of the Aristotelian and Scholastic roots of Brentano’s doctrines, their approach obscures the significance of Brentano’s importation of these doctrines into a philosophical context that is distinctly modern in its epistemological, metaphysical, and methodological bearings. In this regard, it would have been be valuable to consider Brentano’s acknowledged debts to the empiricist philosophy of Descartes, Hume, and Locke as well as to the work of such near-contemporaries as Mill and Comte. An essay devoted to exploring these modern and contemporary influences would serve as an antidote to the temptation to succumb to an over-Scholasticized reading of Brentano’s philosophy, and especially of his empirical psychology. Gestures toward these modern influences may be found in many of the essays in the volume, most notably in Jacquette’s brief discussion in his introductory essay of the burgeoning of a distinctive “Austrian philosophy”. There is, however, no sustained consideration of these influences to counterbalance the strongly Aristotelian reading offered by George and Koehn.

Rounding out the collection are two essays devoted to Brentano’s influence on subsequent philosophy, a tightly focused discussion by Robin Rollinger of “Brentano and Husserl” and a survey piece by Karl Schuhmann on “Brentano’s impact on twentieth-century philosophy”. Rollinger’s essay is helpful for its careful examination of the Brentanian roots of Husserl’s early phenomenology. Considerations of space certainly played a role here, but one would have liked to see similar in-depth discussions of Brentano’s influence on Heidegger and on analytic philosophy. Schuhmann’s broad-ranging essay is helpful as a starting point for explorations of these and other lesser-known lines of influence. Schuhmann also takes up briefly the problem of Brentano’s invisibility, attributing it in part to the latter’s failure to leave behind extensive notes for his lectures (the contrast here with Husserl is striking), and to the fact that many of Brentano’s substantive philosophical theses, as well as the distinctive way in which he practiced philosophy, were learned by his followers not through published writings but quite literally at the master’s feet. As Schuhmann rightly emphasizes, in spite of Brentano’s invisibility it would be difficult to envision the emergence of the phenomenological approach in the absence of its methodological grounding in Brentanian descriptive psychology. Similarly, it would be difficult to imagine later analytic treatments of intentionality and the metaphysics of real vs. irreal objects in the absence of Brentano’s important contributions.


1. Roberto Poli (ed.), The Brentano Puzzle, Brookfield, VT: Ashgate, 1998.

2. David Bell, Husserl, London: Routledge, 1990, p. 4.

3. Franz Brentano, Descriptive Psychology, trans. B. Müller, London: Routledge, 1995, p. 163.

4. Victor Vellarde, On Brentano, Albany, NY: Wadsworth, 1999.