The Cambridge Companion to Critical Theory

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Fred Rush (ed.), The Cambridge Companion to Critical Theory, Cambridge University Press, 2005, 380pp, $27.99 (pbk), ISBN 0-521-01689-4

Reviewed by James Gordon Finlayson, University of Sussex


This volume is the latest in Cambridge University Press's successful series of companions to major philosophers. A companion is intended to be more than a collection of essays on a particular topic. The essays are supposed to be expository as well as critical and scholarly. Taken together, they are meant to cover most of the essential questions raised by the philosopher's work, and thus to provide a conspectus of a 'major' philosopher's work that is both accessible to students and useful for specialists. Frankfurt School critical theory is of course not a major philosopher, but rather a sub-tradition of Hegelian-Marxist social philosophy straddling three generations and including different thinkers from a variety of different disciplines. So it might be wondered whether critical theory as such is an appropriate topic for a single volume Companion. The truth is that such a volume, whatever its merits, is bound to be selective, and will never live up to its billing as an 'overview of the entire history of Critical Theory' (p. i). If that really is the aim, it should have been left to more compendious projects such as the excellent, though now dated, six volume Routledge Series: The Frankfurt School: Critical Assessments.

The Cambridge Companion to Critical Theory is a companion volume to the Companions already dedicated to the Frankfurt philosophers Jürgen Habermas (1995) and T. W. Adorno (2004). One might, then, reasonably expect this volume to give more prominence to the other central figures of the Frankfurt School, Friedrich Pollock, Max Horkheimer, Leo Löwenthal and Herbert Marcuse, and more peripheral but nonetheless important figures such as Walter Benjamin, the social-psychologist Eric Fromm, and the political and legal theorists Franz Neumann and Otto Kirchheimer. And indeed it does, albeit grudgingly and to a small extent. Horkheimer and Marcuse are discussed; Benjamin and Pollock less so. Fromm, Löwenthal, and Neumann, on the other hand, barely get a mention. The figures of Adorno and Habermas loom largest, which reflects the enduring appeal of the one and the contemporary significance of the other more than the historical reality of the Frankfurt school.

The result is a considerable overlap in content between the three Companions, an overlap which is evident already in the choice of contributors. Kenneth Baynes (writing on Habermas's "kantian pragmatism"), Simone Chambers (the politics of critical theory), Stephen K. White (critical social science and pragmatism) and Axel Honneth (the legacy of critical theory) all contributed to the Habermas Companion, while J. M. Bernstein (Adorno's Aesthetic Theory) and Joel Whitebook (critical theory and psychoanalysis) have essays in the Adorno volume. In addition there are essays by Fred Rush (early critical theory), Michael Rosen (Benjamin and Adorno on the aura), Julian Roberts (Dialectic of Enlightenment), Raymond Geuss (dialectics and revolution in Adorno and Marcuse), Moishe Postone (Horkheimer and Pollock on economy and the state), Hauke Brunkhorst (critical theory and mass society) and Beatrice Hanssen (Habermas and Foucault).

The roster of contributors is impressive and most of the contributions are instructive and insightful. Rosen and Geuss in particular have a knack of combining scholarship with argument and analysis, and their respective work on the Frankfurt School ranks among the best there is, and is not as widely appreciated as it might be. Julian Roberts's exposition of Adorno and Horkheimer's Dialectic of Enlightenment as an anti-totalitarian tract and a work of exile (along with Popper's The Open Society and its Enemies and Lukác's The Destruction of Reason) is refreshing, though his trenchant concluding criticisms of a work he claims was born of 'impatience and resentment at the myriad indignities of exile' needs more development and substantiation.

Another refreshing feature of the Companion to Critical Theory is the willingness of many of the contributors, for example Geuss, Postone, White and Chambers, to deal with the admittedly tricky question of the politics of critical theory. By contrast the Cambridge Companion to Adorno edited by Tom Huhn leaves the reader with the distinct impression Adorno that was a cultural critic in the narrow modern day sense, and that his work lacks any real political context or content. Indicative is the index to Huhn's volume which contains zero references to 'politics' or 'revolution'. This makes Lukács's poisonous remark that Adorno, along with most of the German intelligentsia, had retreated to 'Grand Hotel Abyss' to observe the political fray from a position of comfort and luxury, look less unfair than it is. In spite of Adorno's irritating habit of confecting dialectical rationalisations for not participating in the kind of politics he disliked, such as noisy demonstrations, he took his responsibilities as a public intellectual, as a broadcaster, critic and educator extremely seriously indeed. Though half of his work comprised writings on music, and though art plays a pivotal role in his philosophy, Adorno, as Geuss's essay illustrates, cleaves to the idea that a radical qualitative change in the form of life, a social transformation not just a self-transformation, was necessary. Adorno is not to blame for the Adornians who confine their talk about politics and revolutions to the cafés of modern art galleries and other arenas where there is no imminent danger of them spilling their cappuccinos.

In chapter 9 Chambers argues that due to their respective analyses of the historical situation the political content of Adorno's and Horkheimer's work on the one hand and of Marcuse's on the other narrowed into an individual politics of 'engaged withdrawal', which was Socratic rather than Epicurean insofar as they answer the question of how to live with the "teaching of the good life" (p. 223). It is an intriguing and suggestive line of thought, which alas she does not develop. It is also problematic. Socrates was a moralist. Adorno for various reasons, chief among which is the idea of Minima Moralia that a false life cannot be lived rightly, was not. The phrase Chambers quotes from the opening of that book "die Lehre vom richtigen Leben" subtly differs from its English translation. Adorno might agree with Socrates that the unexamined life is not worth living, but he could not and did not teach the good life. Indeed he scrupulously avoided using that term, and argued that not even 'correct' or 'authentic' living is an option. I have my doubts about whether the politics of individual resistance that Adorno both practiced and taught (this is the practical upshot of education towards Mündigkeit) is best described as 'engaged withdrawal.' Chambers, in her anxiety to shoehorn Marcuse, Horkheimer and Adorno into a one-size-fits-all objection, ends up overlooking the differences between them.

Habermas has more faith than any of his Frankfurt predecessors in the possibilities of democratic institutions and their ability to bring about the abolition of social oppression through non-violent, political means. As Chambers points out Habermas recognises that citizens, participants, social agents are the architects of political reform, not political theorists. Fittingly, given his views, Habermas's politics inhere less in his political theory than in his many political writings. It is odd that Chambers concludes that the theories of Nancy Fraser, Seyla Benhabib and Chantal Mouffe have a more 'robust political content' than Habermas's because they are concerned with 'concrete' selves and others rather than 'abstract and generalized' persons, and because their conception of the political places less emphasis on agreement and more on contestation and difference (p. 242-3). These are at most differences in theory and some are more stylistic than substantial. These authors indeed ply different theories and concepts of the political, but it does not follow that therefore their work has a more robust political content. The proof of that pudding is in the eating.

Stephen K. White's essay, which aims to redeem "the very the idea of a critical social science" by giving it a pragmatist turn, is easily the most ambitious, and the only one that is wholly problem-oriented. Though interesting, the idea as he expounds it is too wide and too vague to capture what is specific to Frankfurt School critical social theory, and his description of the problem he thinks critical theory faces, of how it can reliably distinguish the 'real' interests of people from those they merely think they have, is too cursory and unclear to be persuasive. He offers a sketch of an argument that needs to be fleshed out in much greater detail, at greater length, and probably elsewhere than in a Companion. The essay is thus not as informative as it might be, and on one important point it misinforms the reader. White insists that Habermas is a 'foundationalist' (p. 317-8, 327). This appears to be an idée reçue among some scholars of critical theory, for Whitebook explicitly (p. 91) and Hansen implicitly (p. 280) level the same charge. I think it is an egregious mistake. Habermas is not a foundationalist in any appropriate sense of the word, neither about justification, nor about knowledge. Even interpreted loosely, talk about foundationalism is out of place. Habermas has spilt a lot of ink repudiating first-philosophy and subject-object metaphysics, paring down his ontology, criticising the semantics and the epistemology of the Vienna school, while embracing many aspects of pragmatism, and developing what he takes to be a weak transcendental, empirically defeasible, post-metaphysical philosophy. Those who press the charge (on the unargued assumption that a foundationalist about anything is always in the wrong) presumably believe that Habermas is completely mistaken and that he has done just the opposite of what he thinks he has.

No doubt Habermas's theory of meaning as validity is the most controversial component of his theory, so White's criticism targets right general area. But even the idea, which seems to underlie the objection, that Habermas's social, moral and political theory are grounded on his pragmatic theory of meaning and theory of communicative action, and that therefore the former stand and fall with the latter, is erroneous. In fact Habermas's various research programmes, though interrelated, are relatively self-standing, and offer at best mutual collateral support. Failure in one programme would require revisions in another; it might weaken the overall structure, but not undermine it. Though conventional labels never quite seem to fit Habermas's philosophy, its kinship is with coherentism and pragmatism not foundationalism.

The theme of pragmatism provides an interesting undercurrent to several essays in the volume. While White aims to cure Habermas theory of its 'foundationalism' with a dose of pragmatism, Baynes, by means of a comparison with Robert Brandom, attempts to show how Habermas's Kantianism is already tempered by pragmatism. Whereas White repudiates Habermas's central thesis that Verständigung is the telos of speech as a 'strong ontological claim about the essence or telos of language'. (p. 318) Baynes shows, by contrast, and in my view correctly, that it is not an ontological but a pragmatic claim about the social function of speech. Validity-claims to truth and rightness are pragmatic presuppositions of agency. Habermas's 'claim concerning both the existence and presuppositions of communicative action is essentially a claim about what it means to be located in … the space of reasons' (p. 199). This links back to a point that Chambers makes. For Habermas, to be citizen a in a modern liberal democratic state means to give and take reasons, a practice one can only undertake as a participant in a community of other reason givers: the modern politikon zoon is very much still the zoon logon echon, but in a community held together by multiple discourses – moral, ethical, legal, and pragmatic (instrumental), by a market economy and the rule of law.

Though the quality of the essays varies, none are bland. Even the less convincing ones are inherently interesting. And though the collection falls miles short of being the 'overview of the entire history of critical theory' advertised on the back cover, the essays provide shafts of genuine illumination. Rush's opening chapter is well put-together and nicely written, if a little schematic. Unfortunately the same cannot be said for his introduction and the paragraph on the frontispiece, which, though brief, is replete with wild assertions and historical inaccuracies. Is Frankfurt School critical theory really still 'centrally important for philosophy'? Is it still a 'vital philosophical and political perspective', and not rather a tradition that has petered out? Honneth concludes his reflections on its intellectual legacy, much as Habermas did in the 1970's, with the claim that none of the 'core content' of critical theory 'can still be maintained today in the theoretical form in which the members of the Frankfurt School originally developed it .' (p. 357) Whilst these philosophical points are arguable, Rush's historical claim that critical theory 'remained central to European philosophical social and political thought throughout the Cold War period' is simply false. Even in Germany the first generation of Frankfurt School theorists operated on the margins of the academic establishment and were mostly ignored by it. Adorno never received a formal offer of a post at a German university, and only obtained a full professorship in Frankfurt in 1957 by dint of some (much resented) political maneuvering by Horkheimer. Habermas recalls that when he was at the Institute in the 1950's there wasn't such a thing as a Frankfurt School or a Critical Theory; these labels emerged retrospectively as the early work Horkheimer and Adorno became more widely known and appreciated and an understanding of their ideas gradually crystallised in the light of interpretation and criticism

Finally, I should caution that the select bibliography of 'the major works of individual members of the Frankfurt School' (p. 361) is muddled and unhelpful. Under Adorno's works in German there are two entries – the Gesammelte and the Nachgelassene Schriften. There are similar entries for Horkheimer, Marcuse, and Benjamin. By contrast one single book by Pollock is listed, two by Fromm, three by Neumann, zero by Kirchheimer. Some volumes such Habermas's The Inclusion of the Other, which is included in the abbreviations, are not listed in the bibliography (p. xviii & 365). Several of his works, including the important collections Justification and Application, and Truth and Justification, the original versions of which are listed as 'essential sources' do not appear among his 'major works' in English. There is also a curious miscellaneous section entitled 'Works of Critical Theory after Habermas' (p. 366) that includes sundry works by Honneth, Brunkhorst and Martin Seel, two of which were written as early 1985 when Habermas was only 56! This is a minor irritation for someone who knows the literature, but a distinct drawback for someone who does not. The original idea of the Companion was that the apparatus – the substantial bibliography and the historical introduction - made it a more than just a collection of essays. Here the bibliography and the introduction are considerably weaker than the rest of the volume. One is tempted to say that the Companion to Critical Theory is a good collection of essays that doesn't add up to a good companion to critical theory. Perhaps no single collection could. Yet for the quality of its contributions alone the volume is worth reading and repays the effort better than some of its main competitors.