The Cambridge Companion to Dewey

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Molly Cochran (ed.), The Cambridge Companion to Dewey, Cambridge University Press, 2010, 356pp., $31.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521697460.

Reviewed by Matthew Pamental, Northern Illinois University


John Dewey (1859-1952) was America's leading public philosopher for well over half a century. His collected writings take up thirty seven volumes, with several additional volumes devoted to lecture notes provided by his students, and three volumes of correspondence, all published by Southern Illinois University Press. Thus it is inevitable that any collection of writings about Dewey and his thought will be incomplete. In particular, while Dewey's engagement as a public philosopher is mentioned both in Robert Westbrook's intellectual biography and Richard Bernstein's and Molly Cochran's discussions of Dewey's vision of democracy, his public philosophy receives no sustained attention comparable to his epistemology and logic, for example. Given Dewey's commitment to the ideal of philosophy as a tool for resolving the "problems of men," this is a significant lacuna. That said, however, the collection of essays in Cochran's The Cambridge Companion to Dewey ranges impressively -- both widely and deeply -- over Dewey's corpus, including all of Dewey's major works, his intellectual development, and his significance as a philosopher of democracy. In what follows, I will lay out the themes discussed in each section and make a few critical remarks along the way.

Included in the present volume are an introduction by the editor and Westbrook's intellectual biography, followed by thirteen chapters. Cochran helpfully divides these chapters into five sections. The first section consists of chapters by Ruth Anna Putnam, Richard M. Gale, Isaac Levi, and J. E. Tiles, and investigates Dewey's naturalism and logic of inquiry. The second section consists of two essays, by Mark Johnson and Matthias Jung, on Dewey's philosophy of mind and action. In the third section, Jennifer Welchman and James Bohman treat Dewey's ethics, moral and social philosophy. The fourth section is a bit of a catch-all, including essays by Sami Pihlström on Dewey's naturalistic philosophy of religion, Richard Eldridge on Dewey's aesthetics, and Nel Noddings on Dewey's philosophy of education. The final section consists of essays by Bernstein and Cochran on Dewey's conception of democracy and its application to international affairs.

The first two chapters of the volume combine to set the context for the essays that follow. After introducing Dewey by way of a brief comparison between Dewey's faith in the ability of intelligence to resolve social problems and President Obama's belief that America's achievements are the result of individuals' recognition of their shared interests, Cochran describes the Darwinian context that saw the birth of American Pragmatism and its influence on Dewey. She identifies the theory of inquiry as a significant element in Dewey's reconstruction of philosophy, linking it with Dewey's notions of experience, intelligence, and situations before giving the outline of the remainder of the book. Westbrook argues that it is Dewey's faith in democracy that forms the core of his philosophy. He outlines three key points in Dewey's development that cemented democracy as the cornerstone of his philosophy. First, Dewey's first wife, Alice Chipman, influenced Dewey to secularize his democratic faith, moving it away from its neo-Hegelian, social-Christian roots. Second, the "radical populist" political atmosphere of Chicago in the 1890s, and Dewey's relationship with the activist Franklin Ford, led Dewey to the idea that democracy can only be fulfilled when free inquiry is connected with free and full communication. Third, Dewey's connection with Jane Addams and the Hull House, as well as his involvement in the Chicago Laboratory School, allowed him to connect Addams' ability to do good for the needy to his emerging ideas about democratic education. Between Cochran's introduction and Westbrook's intellectual biography, the reader is provided with plentiful background information from which to begin developing an understanding of Dewey's thought and its place in history.

The section on Dewey's naturalism -- his logic, metaphysics, and epistemology -- constitutes the largest block of text considering any of Dewey's views. To be sure, those three topics are of considerable interest for philosophers -- students and professionals alike. However, there is a significant degree of overlap among the four essays, and so one wonders at the inclusion of so many. On the other hand, taken together these essays provide links to contemporary discussions of knowledge, truth, experience, the fact/value gap, the cognitivism/noncognitivism debate, and the realist/antirealist debate, to name but a few.

Putnam spells out Dewey's epistemology. She pays particular attention to Dewey's account of perception, the way in which it restores a discussion of qualities to the post-Galilean conception of science, and how that, in turn, allows Dewey to overcome the fact/value dichotomy and maintain a consistent naturalism about both. Gale provides perhaps the most idiosyncratic interpretation of Dewey's views, not just because it goes against the grain of most interpretations, but also because it posits an "unannounced" metaphysics underlying what Dewey actually says. Gale places Dewey's metaphysics in the tradition of all great metaphysics, from Aristotle to Kant, because Dewey's basic metaphysical postulates are unverifiable (75), whereas Dewey -- as Gale himself points out -- saw himself as breaking from that tradition.

Levi also deviates slightly from the pattern of the essays. Rather than explicating Dewey's logic, Levi points out where his own views on logic have been influenced by the work of Peirce and Dewey and argues for a "corrective" view of both. In particular, Levi prefers Peirce's 'removal of doubt' to Dewey's 'resolution to a problematic situation' as the goal of logical inquiry, and he draws out the implications of taking that stance rather than Dewey's. Despite their divergence from the pattern of the essays, however, both Gale and Levi provide sufficient textual material from Dewey to support their views and provide sufficient argument for their views for anyone interested to pursue the matter further. This reviewer, at least, would wish for somewhat more from Levi's article by way of connecting his way of understanding the logic of inquiry to the contemporary literature.

Tiles rounds out the section with a discussion of the primacy of practice in Dewey's empiricism. Tiles begins with Dewey's notion of experience, showing how he broke from the phenomenalism of his empiricist predecessors, but also how his empiricism diverges from Quine's. He draws out the implications of Dewey's 'practical starting point' for his views on practical judgments and knowledge before engaging in a critique of Dewey on realism and the notion of necessity, concluding that Dewey could have accepted a pragmatic account of necessity rather than abandoning it altogether.

The section on philosophy of mind and action gives a thorough account of the affinities between Dewey's functional account of the "body-mind" and contemporary cognitive neuroscience. Johnson's work outlines the basics of Dewey's embodied theory of human cognition. He concludes that pragmatism has much to offer current cognitive science, including a general philosophical background for elaborating an embodied theory of human cognition, a platform for criticizing mistaken methodological assumptions, and a way of interpreting the implications of cognitive science that are relevant to our ordinary lives. Jung's essay begins from an understanding of Dewey's account of the mind largely in sync with Johnson's, but applies that understanding to the contemporary literature in social action theory. Most action theory, Jung argues, rests on presuppositions that are made problematic by Dewey's theory of mind. Dewey's view undermines, in particular, the account of intentionality that undergirds both rational choice theory and normative theories of action, replacing their account of rationality with situated, embodied cognition and forcing a new understanding of the teleology of human action. Jung notes that Dewey reverses the traditional individual-social order of agency, making us social first, individuals later. Finally, Jung concludes by noting that the way values comprise a qualitative aspect of experience enables us to not only start from a normative perspective but also to use the normative aspects of our experience to shape our ends, and that this distinguishes Dewey's from utilitarian and normative theories of social action, as well as bridging the gap between facts and values.

The third section focuses on Dewey's moral philosophy. Welchman's essay spells out his basic views by way of a series of contrasts with contemporary meta-ethics. First, she points out that Dewey's views undermine the dichotomy between cognitivism and noncognitivism about moral motivation. Second, she shows how his views stand as a rejection of positivism and expressivism about values. Next, she explicates Dewey's account of the distinction between valuing or prizing and what he termed valuation or evaluating. This distinction reveals Dewey's rejection of the means-ends dichotomy: for him, ends and means are reciprocally determining. From here, she moves through a discussion of Dewey's account of practical reasoning, which itself reveals that he was a pluralist about the fundamental sources of value. Dewey's pluralism, coupled with his fallibilism and empirical naturalism, led him to be an anti-absolutist about moral principles, which he took to be tools for the investigation of problematic situations, rather than absolute guides to moral conduct. From all of this, Welchman concludes that Dewey should be thought of as a "pluralistic welfare consequentialist," and she concludes by elaborating on this view. Bohman focuses on Dewey's social-psychology in order to generate a defense of Dewey's notion of social democracy. In particular, Bohman points to the context-sensitivity of human moral judgment as the key to overcoming skepticism such as Walter Lippmann's about the possibility of collective decision-making. According to Bohman, democracy is the ideal form of collective governance because it alone provides the space for the proper methods of collective deliberation.

As I mentioned, the next section is a bit of a catch-all. Pihlström's essay reveals the connection between Dewey's naturalism and his conception of religious faith. Dewey's naturalism leaves no room for supernatural entities, but this leads to a question: is Dewey's naturalism compatible with a plausible account of the religious qualities of experience, or does it reduce such qualities to something else? Intriguingly, Pihlström thinks that we can construct a plausible religious naturalism by making a transcendental move. Eldridge's essay details Dewey's aesthetics, primarily as it is described in Art as Experience.[1] Eldridge identifies two themes in Dewey's aesthetic: that the artistic act is performed for the sake of aesthetic experience, and that aesthetic experience is the consummation of human activity, whose significance is a function of the character of the activity (245). Dewey's concern was that modern industrial life bifurcates work and meaning, where work is merely instrumental to money or power, and happiness is simply pleasure. On the contrary, Dewey argued, art concerns any activity that manipulates things outside the body such that the rearrangement produces an experience not possible with things in their unadulterated state. Such an experience -- whether in the artist or in an audience -- is aesthetic when the object created brings an enhanced appreciation of its qualities. If we understand aesthetic experience as linked with works of art that project qualities found in ordinary experience as ideals, then art and aesthetic experience can spur us to improve our practices in light of those ideals (258).

In the final essay in this section, Noddings examines Dewey's views of the child, the curriculum, learning and inquiry, democracy, and moral education. Her three main criticisms of Dewey are that a) he reduces thinking to the pattern of inquiry, ignoring the thought patterns of poets, fiction writers, and nature writing; b) he under-emphasizes the relational elements of problematic situations, leaving out an examination of the humans who have the problem; and c) his criterion for evaluating ways of social life -- a crucial element in determining the shape of schools and the curriculum -- is vague enough to be satisfied by fascism. Noddings suggests that the care perspective offers an acceptable corrective to Dewey's views.

The final section of the book brings us back to Dewey's commitment to democracy. Bernstein reminds us that, for Dewey, democracy is an ethos, or a "mode of associated living."[2] As such, it is an ethical ideal more than simply a set of political institutions. Dewey's democratic faith is the faith that every citizen is capable of taking responsibility for their share of ruling and that together, collectively, we can make better decisions than we do individually. Thus, Dewey's is a radical notion of democracy, involving as it does two claims. First, freedom and individuality can only be attained by means that are consistent with these ends. Second, the end of democracy is radical because a) it has never been attempted, let alone attained, and b) it would require drastic changes to our current institutions. While Dewey may be faulted for being vague or silent on the mechanisms of institutional change, we need to remember that Dewey was a leading reformer of his time, advocating for democratic reforms against the tide of industrialization and globalization.

According to Cochran, Dewey's thinking offers several advantages, in that 1) he points to the next step in moral education, namely, beyond loyalty to the nation-state, 2) he provides a tool for thinking about democracy, namely, the public, and 3) he provides a criterion, namely growth, for the evaluation of transnational processes. Scholarship of international relations should pay attention to Dewey's ideas, she argues, because he offers a way of thinking about global publics and a concern for individuals in international decision-making. If we put Dewey's conception of democratic publics together with his model of inquiry, we can see that the problem is getting individuals to recognize shared, international interests. While difficult, the seeds of such recognition can be seen, Cochran argues, in current events (327). Whereas some might see Dewey's advocacy of democracy at this level as a form of cultural imperialism, Dewey warned against imperialism and critiqued America for its failings in this regard, arguing instead for moral education and growth toward democracy.

All told, the chapters in Cochran's volume are of consistently high quality, even when the interpretations offered are not in the mainstream of Dewey scholarship. In addition, the bibliography is sufficient to give both student and non-specialist alike a place to start in pursuing matters further. As I said at the beginning, however, Dewey's public engagement goes largely unconnected to his more theoretical work. One other lacuna in the volume is the absence of reference to Dewey's fellow pragmatists. Again, while they do get mentioned, the only sustained comparison comes from Jung's chapter, comparing Dewey and Peirce on the nature and purpose of logical inquiry. However, it is a danger of any volume that purports to introduce students and non-specialists to the work of a major philosopher that it leave out aspects of that individual's work, and, to her credit, Cochran has assembled a cast of authors who minimized that danger. The Cambridge Companion to Dewey will serve as an excellent source for individuals who want to get a broad understanding of Dewey's views or who simply want a concise explication of most of the important elements of his philosophy.

[1] (1934, LW10). Following the citation method in the book, all references to Dewey's works are to the Collected Works of John Dewey, edited by Jo Ann Boydston (Carbondale: Southern Illinois University Press). The Collected Works are divided into three sets: The Early Works, 1882-1898 (EW), The Middle Works, 1899-1924 (MW), and The Later Works, 1925-1953 (LW). References are to year, volume, and page number of the relevant set.

[2] (1916, MW9:93)