The Cambridge Companion to Existentialism

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Steven Crowell (ed.), The Cambridge Companion to Existentialism, 412 pp., Cambridge University Press, 2012, $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521732789.

Reviewed by Michael R. Kelly, Boston College


One could say without exaggeration that academic philosophers have neglected existentialism over the past several decades. No longer academically fashionable, it's not surprising that existentialism courses are offered rarely -- if ever in some departments -- at the graduate level. When one thus goes to teach such a course at the undergraduate level, it is likewise unsurprising that one finds very little quality secondary literature.[1] This latest volume in Cambridge University's growing list of 'companions' to figures associated with a philosophical movement and/or historical period contributes in an important way to correcting this deficiency and perhaps halting this cycle. Some remarks on the general content and structure of the volume will support these points.

An impressive list of highly respected commentators -- all of whom work within, or in dialogue with, the tradition in which academic philosophy has placed existentialism, namely, 'continental' philosophy -- present generally clear and thoughtful essays. Every piece is expository, introducing the target audience, "students" (14), to major existentialist "figures" (e.g., Soren Kierkegaard, Friedrich Nietzsche, Martin Heidegger, Jean-Paul Sartre), "concepts" (e.g., existence preceding essence, self, death, Angst, authenticity, commitment, ambiguity, identity), and related topics (e.g., literature, religion, politics, psychology). Perhaps more importantly -- and as a way to avoid redundancy with other 'companions' devoted to existentialist thinkers -- many of the contributions are also critical scholarly pieces that "performatively . . . demonstrate the vitality of existential thought" by examining issues in existentialism "philosophically pertinent" for contemporary philosophical research (14).

Part of what makes the work successful, moreover, is the way it overcomes the unique challenges that any companion to existentialism faces, namely, the fact that existentialism arguably was more a cultural or literary movement than a technical philosophical movement and seemingly everyone associated with it denied being an existentialist. Steven Crowell, however, applies an organizational principle to this companion that manages to overcome both challenges, capturing the broader reach of existentialism despite "restricting" itself -- or perhaps because it restricts itself -- "to philosophical existentialism" (15).

The bookends of the volume comprehensively present existentialism's historical and cultural dimensions. The first main section broadly situates the existentialist movement with two very fine essays, David Cooper's "Existentialism as a philosophical movement" and William McBride's "Existentialism as a cultural movement." The last main section of often exemplary essays details existentialism's relation to, and continuing influence on, related fields in Jeff Malpas's "Existential as Literature," Merold Westphal's "Existentialism and Religion," Robert Bernasconi's "Racism is a system: how existentialism became dialectical in Fanon and Sartre," and Matthew Ratcliff and Matthew Broome's "Existential phenomenology, psychiatric illness, and the death of possibilities."

The third main section, on "Major Existentialist Philosophers," is predominantly a series of couplets on the major philosophical figures in existentialism: Alastair Hannay, "Kierkegaard's single individual and the point of indirect communication" and Hubert Dreyfus, "'What monster then is man': Pascal and Kierkegaard on being a contradictory self and what to do about it"; Richard Schacht, "Nietzsche after the death of God" and Lawrence Hattab, "Nietzsche: selfhood, creativity, and philosophy"; William Blattner, "Heidegger: the existential analytic of Dasein" and Karsten Harries, "The antinomy of being: Heidegger's critique of humanism"; and Steven Crowell, "Sartre's existentialism and the nature of consciousness" and Thomas Flynn, "Political existentialism: the career of Sartre's political thought." There are also single essays on Beauvoir and Merleau-Ponty: Kristina Arp's "Simone de Beauvoir's existentialism: freedom and ambiguity in the human world" and Taylor Carman's "Merleau-Ponty on body, flesh, and visibility." The essays in this section largely provide reliable introductions to a broad range of themes in the thinkers considered 'existentialist'. Moreover, most provide insightful introductions to the existential themes in each thinker's works. The strategy of including double entries on most of these thinkers creates the space to explore the peculiarity of existentialism generated by its inclusion of figures who deny being existentialists and/or are denied such inclusion, as well as to explore the richness of their thought for contemporary research.

The first of Crowell's two essays, "Existentialism and its legacy," deserves special attention, for it is less an introduction to existentialism than a thought-provoking 'manifesto' on the vibrancy of this seemingly dormant philosophical movement. The motivating conception for the volume and Crowell's introduction is the "thesis that existential concepts and ideas have much to teach us as we pursue philosophy in a climate quite removed from the one in which they initially appeared" (4). Crowell is likely advancing more than the trivially true observation that our social-political climate is historically different from that of the late nineteenth and early twentieth century. His claim could be taken to imply something about the atmosphere surrounding the 'divide' in contemporary academic philosophy. That existentialist concepts continue to inform continental philosophy -- even if some would dispute such a claim -- would surprise no one, and Crowell interestingly evidences this point by turning to two thinkers who fall outside the existentialist movement in their early work only to return to existential themes in their late works, Jacques Derrida and Michel Foucault (11-14). That one finds existentialist concepts -- as Crowell does, following John Haugeland -- in "philosophy of science and philosophy of mind" and "in dialogue with 'analytic' philosophers such as Daniel Dennett, John Searle, and John McDowell," however, likely will surprise many (5-6). But, as Crowell provocatively proposes, perhaps Thomas Kuhn's critique of positivism, which rendered "obsolete" the divide that placed value in the hands of 'existentialists' rather than fact-minded scientists, "opened space for a 'new existentialism'" (6-7).

If at this point one chafes at Crowell's proposal about a 'new existentialism', perhaps one will more easily accept his claim that existentialist concepts are prevalent today in moral psychology (7). To support this point, Crowell considers Bernard Williams's account of "tensions that exist between issues . . . in ethical inquiry and the 'impartial standpoint' demanded by traditional philosophical analysis, . . . between what is meaningful and what is rationally groundable," as one that can bring into relief in a different context "what is at stake in Heidegger's notion of authenticity or Camus's notion of the absurd" (7). Similar points are made about a range of 'analytic' philosophers: Harry Frankfurt's notion of care, Charles Taylor's notion of strong evaluation, Steven Darwall's revival of the second-person perspective, and Christine Korsgaard's concept of practical identity that "channels the existentialist idea of commitment" in her inquiry into the sources of normativity (7-11).

Whether one considers Crowell's assessment of the relation between analytic philosophy and existential themes an instance of the former coopting the latter; whether one considers Crowell's assessment evidence that analytic philosophy is beginning to outgrow its detached and abstracted mode of thinking and embrace a view of philosophy as a way of life rather than a science, it is indisputable that a such dialogue is underway. It may be a new existentialism, or a renewal of existentialism, or a renewal of analytical philosophy -- depending on one's commitments -- but in any event the dialogue speaks to existentialism being "as much a legacy as it is a history" (4). Many essays in the collection likewise are worthy of close reading by students and scholars alike, while only a very few should be approached critically. I shall review a selection of some of each in a way that complement's Crowell's detailed introductory overview.

Cooper's "Existentialism as a philosophical movement" is a clearly written introduction that effectively argues, "the denial that there was an existentialist family or movement is . . . implausible" (29). Cooper carefully presents and unravels the tensions and inconsistencies in existentialist doctrine across its representative figures; for example, Albert Camus's disagreement with Heidegger, Sartre, et al. about whether human beings are fundamentally estranged from a fundamentally absurd world (31). Casting out Camus and other literary figures from the existentialist movement enables Cooper to disabuse readers of certain stereotypical readings of existentialism (30-1). Existentialists do not advocate, he argues, a life uninformed by rational reflection. Indeed, we should reject the "popular picture of the existentialist hero [as] someone choosing or creating ex nihilo . . . " for one of "a person . . . resolutely prepared to stand back from his or her situation and commitments, calmly to consider these and the alternative to them, and only then to take a decision . . . for which responsibility is fully accepted" (30, 43-4).

McBride's essay on the cultural dimension of existentialism will resonate more with readers intent on preserving literary figures in the existentialist movement (51). He provides a clear account of the origin of the term (51), a helpful discussion of the post-war condition that made existentialism's emphasis on the "unconventional" attractive (55), and a valuable overview of the bifurcation of the movement into Christian and secular forms (52). Those interested in the fractured relations between Camus and Sartre and between Sartre and Maurice Merleau-Ponty will find here, moreover, a useful narrative of the role communism played in these figures' political thought and action (56, 58-9). Readers of the volume will find three major strands of thought in McBride's essay -- literature, religion, and politics -- neatly and quite helpfully developed in the closing section of the work.

Jeff Malpas's very fine essay on existentialism as literature presents a sober yet convincing argument (against Cooper, perhaps) in favor of including literature in the movement of existentialism. Malpas distinguishes between the "existentialist and the existential," where the former denotes "an attitude or mood that . . . thematizes the problematic character of human existence in a world where there is no pre-given source of meaning . . . " and the latter denotes "that which pertains to existence." This distinction, in turn, enables one to argue, without reducing all literature to existentialist literature, that existential concerns are a part of literature (293). What follows is an impressively succinct yet illuminating overview of the most important works of Fydor Dostoyevsky, Camus, Franz Kafka, Samuel Beckett, and Herman Hesse, as well as the literary works of Sartre and Simone de Beauvoir. Also useful for those new to existentialism or existential literature are the series of synoptic assessments of the relations between Dostoyevsky and Camus (298, 308); Kafka and Camus (298); Beckett and Sartre, Beauvoir, and Camus (312); and Hesse and Dostoyevsky and Hesse and Sartre (313). Amidst this sparkling clear essay, Malpas develops in detail the driving insight of Camus's thought -- "the need for the renunciation of violence and the recognition of life as the only real value," our "being bound to the earth, to sea, and to sun, to a finite and fragile existence that always stands under the shadow of death and yet nevertheless allows of a certain happiness" -- showing that there is reason to philosophically situate Camus closer to the late Heidegger than to Sartre (309-10).

The voice and words of an author -- a philosopher -- who has devoted his (academic) life to thinking about, writing about, and living through existentialism and religion comes to us in Merold Westphal's contribution. With a passion reflecting this 'commitment', Westphal invites us in his introduction to recognize that existentialism has remained with us, philosophers, assuming we think existentialism and the history of philosophy correctly:

It is often said that existentialism has passed into the history of philosophy. But that is a problem only if we think of that history as a kind of museum in which we become antiquarians who observe animals no longer living or artifacts no longer useful. It has nothing to do with us. But if we have an existential spirit we will not read any of the history of philosophy that way. We will hear the texts of the great thinkers as voices that address us directly, offering interpretations of our being-in-the-world full of possibilities for our belief, our actions, and our affects or attitudes. It has everything to do with us . . . (322)

By detailing the thought of four thinkers who radically emphasize the self by way of radically different relations to religion -- Kierkegaard, Nietzsche, Sartre, and Gabriel Marcel -- Westphal undertakes to convince the reader that "existentialism is about the urgency of deciding what to do with our lives . . . with my own life" (322-23). His essay constitutes a most reliable introduction not only to the thinkers examined, but also to their existentialist concepts and ideas.

While I cannot recount all of what is so valuable in this essay, the material on Kierkegaard traces some exceptionally complex concepts in the Kierkegaard's work in an exceptionally clear way. Westphal notes Kierkegaard's distinction between faith and religion -- where the latter denotes "three modes of being-in-the-world" -- and details the notions of the "aesthetic, the ethical, and the religious" attitudes as "different answers to the question, what makes the good life good?" (323). To shed light on this Kierkegaardian distinction, Westphal returns to the biblical context of the New Testament regarding faith as pistis, which, beyond the Platonic reduction of pistis to an inferior status as a "cognitive act of our sensible faculty," means "trust and obedience" as an "act of a whole person in relation to a personal God" (325). Rather than try to prove the reasonableness of faith -- and here Westphal provides a most convincing reading to a most perplexing claim in Fear and Trembling -- Kierkegaard "insists that faith goes against reason," is "absurd," because "that is how [faith] does and should look from the standpoint of the Enlightenment Project's interpretation(s) of human cognitive powers" (326-27). With this in mind, we can see why faith is a 'leap' that involves risk, passion, and urgency -- all of which entail a very personal commitment. Students and scholars alike will learn from the valuable insights in the following parts of this essay -- in particular, the account of Nietzsche's legacy in Sartre's atheistic existentialism (333, 336).

The remaining two essays in this section demonstrate the legacy of existentialism, its influence on varying fields of research, to different degrees of success. Bernasconi demonstrates the continued relevance and reach of existentialist ethics by presenting a persuasive account of the mutual influence between Sartre and Fanon. In the process of providing helpful introductions to Fanon's Black Skin, White Mask and its impact on Sartre's Critique of Dialectical Reason (353), Bernasconi establishes that it was not just that Fanon brought Sartre to the insight that racism is a system of thought, but also that the Fanon was an existentialist in his own right -- and perhaps "was . . . the better existentialist" (359).

Ratcliffe and Broome, in another vein, suggest that the existentialist account of interpersonal relations remains valuable for contemporary psychiatry's understanding of certain forms of illness, e.g., depression, schizophrenia (369, 372). It is a solid essay that is not without interest. Yet the authors pay only limited attention to Heidegger (375, 378-79) and Merleau-Ponty (375) beyond their introductory overview and thus focus too narrowly on Sartre's existentialism -- and indeed on standard accounts of Sartre on shame, the body, and the death of possibilities -- to persuade the reader of the full relevance of existentialism for contemporary psychiatry. Their broader strategy seems to be -- despite their testimony (364) -- one of opposing Sartre's thought to the "folk psychology" understandings of interpersonal relations, thereby establishing the former as a "plausible interpretive framework" with "appeal" (373-74). Without a substantive comparative analysis of the methodological merits of Sartre's phenomenological existentialism over contemporary psychiatry's approach for understanding fundamental issues regarding mental illness, however, it's difficult to appreciate the appeal.

Two essays in the second main section fail, for very different reasons, to satisfy the objectives of the volume. Carman's distinctively lucid prose and mastery of Merleau-Ponty's Phenomenology of Perception are on display in his entry. The essay is a good introduction to the French phenomenologist of the body's major published text and theme. It even contains a lengthy discussion of Merleau-Ponty's Schneider that sets up a promising interpretation of the transition in Merleau-Ponty's thought from phenomenology to ontology, from Phenomenology of Perception to The Visible and the Invisible (276-80). Nevertheless, Carman does little to bring into relief just what is 'existentialist' about Merleau-Ponty's work. Indeed, I cannot find a single substantive mention of the word, 'existentialism,' in his entry.

Dreyfus' essay on Pascal and Kierkegaard I find rather disappointing. There likely is a good case to be made for Pascal as the harbinger of Christian existentialism, but after a brief, two-page overview of Pascal on the contradictory self as a synthesis of the Judeo-Christian tradition (98-9), no mention is made of him. Dreyfus suggests that Pascal can be seen as an anticipation of Kierkegaard, who is 'Pascalian' in that he likewise holds that the "self is a hopeless tension unable to resolve its internal contradictions" (101). Noting that this hopelessness generates a sickness in man that, according to Kierkegaard, paradoxically is "man's great advantage over the beast" insofar as man is "aware of this sickness," Dreyfus overlooks an opportunity to explain in more detail the relation between these thinkers on this score; this is especially striking since Pascal, with somewhat different objectives at stake, describes something like this 'promising' sickness when he notes, "the greatness of human beings consists in their ability to know their wretchedness."[2]

In attempting to explain the Kierkegaardian sense of commitment that overcomes this hopelessness or despair, Dreyfus appeals to Kierkegaard's notions in Fear and Trembling of the knight of infinite resignation and the knight of faith (as told through the narrative of the lad and the princess, whose love the lad never can have but to whom the lad nevertheless unconditionally commits his life). For Dreyfus, it is commitment itself that overcomes the despair generated by this synthetic tension that is the self, for "if you are unconditionally committed to a particular person or cause, that will be your identity forever, that is, for the rests of your life" (104-06). But this is an incorrect reading of Kierkegaard, for unconditional commitment alone is not faith and faith alone overcomes despair. The lad committed -- infinitely resigned -- to the idea of a princess with whom he never will have to relate in reality does not grapple with the temporal; i.e., the lad commits himself 'eternally' to the princess in a way that transforms his life, but this transformation shelters him from the temporal reality -- he will relate to this woman in ideality only -- because he makes, as Kierkegaard puts it, only a 'single-movement'. Dreyfus's notion of unconditional commitment thus obscures the distinction between resignation and faith. The crucial distinction between these two characters, however, is that the lad 'resigns' himself to never getting the princess' love in this life and this is precisely what distinguishes him from Abraham and his faith by which believes he will lose Isaac and yet get him back in this life, thus making a 'double-movement'.[3] It may be that the structure of commitment is what counts in one's life, and this may be good existentialism, but it is a rather misleading picture of Kierkegaard's thought.

The majority of the essays in this second major section fare much better than these. Of notable merit are Hannay's account of Kierkegaard's method of indirect communication and the singularity of the self, Crowell's discussion of the fundamentally existential underpinnings of Sartre's view of pre-reflective self-awareness or consciousness, and Flynn's even-handed account of the strengths and weaknesses of Sartre's political existentialism. Likewise useful are Schacht's account of how Nietzsche's attempt to overcome nihilism distinguishes his thought from existentialism (121-23) and how the latter's Dionysian sensibility contrasts with both Christian and secular existentialism (129-30, 132). And Hattab's entry on Nietzsche continues this theme of Nietzsche's ambiguous relation to existentialism while at the same time explaining how Nietzsche's "stylistic choices" become part of the existentialist legacy (18, 153-55). It must suffice to say that each essay will reward reading and reading again.

Both Heidegger entries not only provide exceptionally clear overviews of Heidegger's broader thought and its relation to existentialism, but each also offers the reader original insights into specific dimensions of Heidegger's thought. Blattner's essay is an exemplary instance of a contribution for a volume like this. He lucidly yet succinctly presents to those new to Heidegger a flawless primer on the basics of the existential themes in Being and Time, e.g., throwness, facticity (as it differs from the factual), death (as it differs from perishing), possibility, authenticity, understanding, disposedness, anxiety, care, conscience, resoluteness, and the social dimension of Dasein. Beyond these clear overviews and helpful distinctions, Blattner presents a compelling discussion of vulnerability as a feature of Dasein's life that can bring it to "live in a new way" (170). The vulnerability of 'that-for-the-sake-of-which' one lives one's life is not to be thought of as a condition that invites a careless preparedness to abandon our commitments because they are contingent and fragile. Rather, Blattner proposes that "to be aware of the vulnerability of one's deepest commitments and entanglements is to be prepared to struggle for them" (171) -- a point that perhaps the reader can productively bring to Dreyfus' essay. Elegantly developing this discussion of vulnerability into an illuminating way to understand Heidegger's notion of 'anticipatory resoluteness', Blattner explains this "resoluteness" as one "that has fully integrated the vulnerability of Dasein's world, commitments, entanglements, passions and attunements into the manner in which it is resolutely open to the current factical situation" (173).

Harries' entry is a fine introduction not only to Heidegger's "Letter on Humanism," but also to what Sartre meant by the description of existentialism as a humanism (186-88, 190). Moreover, Harries fashions his contribution in such a way that reveals Heidegger's turn (Kehre) as a deepening of the inquiry into the question of being (181), why Heidegger believed Sartre's existentialism was a humanism (to be rejected), and a subtle account of how Heidegger himself came to reject (the humanist elements of) national socialism (182-83). Beyond just a clear introduction to these complex and controversial issues, Harries neatly returns his discussion to an account of later Heidegger's thought as a modified Kantian humanism understood as a humanism that is a care for our humanity in the modern condition of our "homelessness" (196-97).

The closing word of this review is reserved for Arp's impassioned argument for the distinctiveness and originality of Beauvoir's existentialist thought. Though the volume does not include an essay devoted to the relation between feminism and existentialism (13-14), Arp's essay successfully demonstrates the existentialist elements of one of feminism's foundational figures. She introduces the reader with ease to Beauvoir's fundamental works -- "Pyrrus and Cineas," She came to StayThe Ethics of Ambiguityand The Second Sex -- and the enduring importance of her work for existential ethics character formation (260-64). Arp explains clearly the notion of ambiguity and its importance for Beauvior's thought, and also establishes Beauvior's philosophical acumen precisely insofar as her deep understanding of Hegel's [master-slave] dialectic (267-69) rather than the supposed influence from Sartre enabled her to understand why it is that "one is not born, but becomes, woman" (265) -- and thus why Beauvoir controversially held women to be "complicit in their own oppression" (269).

With very few exceptions, the essays in this volume will admirably fill the existing gap in secondary literature on existentialism. They also very well might trigger a renaissance in contemporary philosophical research on existential concepts and themes -- in both analytic and continental philosophy.

[1] Exceptions to such generalizations exist, of course. Here are three that I believe worth more than a look: David Cooper, Existentialism: A Reconstruction (Oxford: Blackwell, 1999); John Haugland, "Toward a New Existentialism" in Having Thought: Essays in the Metaphysics of Mind (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1998); Jack Reynolds, Understanding Existentialism (Chesham: Acumen Press, 2006); and Felicity Joseph, Jack Reynolds, and Ashley Woodward, eds. The Continuum Companion to Existentialism (London: Continuum, 2011).

[2] B. Pascal, Pensees and Other Writings, trans. H. Levi (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1995), aphorism 105.

[3] See S. Kierkegaard, Fear and Trembling, ed., trans., H. V. Hong and E. H. Hong (Princeton: Princeton University Press), pp. 20, 41-50.