The Cambridge Companion to Fichte

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David James and Günter Zöller (eds.), The Cambridge Companion to Fichte, Cambridge University Press, 2016, 419 pp., $110.00 (hbk.), ISBN 9780521472265.

Reviewed by Angelica Nuzzo, Graduate Center, City University of New York


As in all "companion" volumes -- a genre that has become increasingly popular in recent years -- this book offers an overarching account of Johann Gottlieb Fichte's philosophy that addresses the historical context, the main systematic issues, and the different disciplinary fields of his thought, and also gives an overview of its successive reception (from the contemporary debate in Fichte's own time to today's reception in the philosophy of mind). Such an overarching account is particularly important and useful in the case of a philosopher who never published an organized "system," as his contemporary Hegel did, or whose philosophy does not seem to have followed a clearly outlined progressive development, such as Kant's critical thought. In addition, given the historical position that Fichte occupies in what is generally called "classical German Philosophy," namely, the crucial transitional position "between Kant and Hegel," the volume offers contributions on Fichte's relation to Kant (Wayne M. Martin, chapter 1), early German Romanticism (Elizabeth Millan), Schelling (Sebastian Gardner), and Hegel (David James).

As is customary in a volume of this sort, the essays are preceded by a brief chronology and followed by a useful bibliography. The volume aims to introduce Fichte's thought to "the English-speaking reader" (1). Indeed, English-speaking readers have traditionally been far behind in all things Fichtean when compared to European readers. This has been due to the lack of English translations of Fichte's work as well as the focus generally accorded to the historical end-markers (Kant and Hegel) of the trajectory on which Fichte is located. To be sure, things have changed in the last few decades due to the remarkable efforts of many scholars (efforts both aimed at the translation of Fichte's work and at its general dissemination,) among which I mention only Daniel Breazeale and Günter Zöller (both with essays in this volume). While this Cambridge Companion should be considered the latest effort to bring Fichte's thought closer to the English-speaking reader, we should also recognize that it builds on significant previous work, that the contributions are more than simple and straightforward introductions.

The fourteen essays are arranged in four groups. The first aims at positioning Fichte's philosophy within the transitional trajectory that leads from Kant to Hegel; the second takes Fichte's foundational idea of Wissenschaftslehre, or "Doctrine of Science" (or, in Fichte's own words, "science of science as such": GA I/2, 117-118) as its focus; the third concentrates on the different specific domains to which the Wissenschaftslehre, i.e., its principles and method, are applied; the fourth deals with issues of reception. I will follow this division in my discussion.

Wayne Martin's and Frederick Beiser's essays place Fichte in his contemporary scene. Martin addresses Fichte's response to the novel Kantian project of critical and transcendental philosophy, while Beiser makes central the relation of Fichte's philosophy to the contemporary revolutionary events in France. In both cases, vast topics are aptly presented in an introductory way. Martin connects Fichte's response to Kant to what may today appear to be 'minor' (yet at the time were central) intermediary figures responsible for channeling, either in a critical or in a supporting way, the contemporary debate on Kant's criticism to which Fichte in turn relates in formulating his own project of transcendental philosophy. In this regard, Martin addresses Jacobi's influential challenge to Kant's claims about the unknowability of things in themselves on the one hand, and of their alleged causal interaction with our senses on the other, as well as Reinhold's efforts in his Elementarphilosophie to bring Kant's criticism to a broader public and his important formulation of the "principle of consciousness." Fichte's early response to Kant, like Schelling's and Hegel's, owes an important debt to these figures. For example, Fichte's early review of Schulze's work for the Allgemeine Literaturzeitung, in which he comes to the first formulation of the notion of a Wissenschaftslehre, is a confrontation with a skeptic critic of Reinhold.

Beiser begins by problematizing the relation of Fichte's 1794 Wissenschaftslehre to the French Revolution and, more broadly, the relation of Fichte's foundational philosophy and his politics. He asks: "What relevance does the critique of the thing-in-itself have for political freedom?" (38). Beiser builds a case for the "complete interdependence of Fichte's early philosophy and politics" (39), claiming that the epistemological objectives to which Fichte directs his novel Doctrine of Science could not have been achieved without the support of his politics. Ultimately, he presents Fichte's own brand of (epistemological) criticism as a form of (political) "liberation."

The next group of essays take a closer look at this distinctive Fichtean "Wissenschaftslehre," significantly never the title of a published text but rather Fichte's way of designating his philosophy. While Fichte's ongoing re-visitation of this idea of philosophy as Doctrine of Science throughout his life may be haunting and confusing for many students, this part of the volume provides a good orientation to the main stages of its development. Christian Klotz examines the 1794-95 Foundation of the Entire Science of Knowledge with regard to the problem of consciousness and its dynamic structure. While Fichte's early philosophy is generally considered a re-visitation and transformation of Kant's transcendental project that deepens the role and function of a unitary subjectivity (both theoretical and practical), at the center of the 1794-95 work is the attempt to address the unresolved question that many contemporary philosophers see at the core of Kant's own philosophy. At stake is the explanation of the possibility of the unity of the theoretical and practical functions of subjectivity, i.e., the explanation of how the cognitive and perceptual account of the world of objects relates to the subject's practical, i.e., active and transforming, relation to them. Klotz follows Fichte's answer to this crucial problem in the articulation of the two parts of 1794-95 Foundation, offering a clear and succinct account of Fichte's complex, often meandering, argument.

Daniel Breazeale tackles the presentation of Fichte's Wissenschaftslehre in the 1796-99 lectures known as the Wissenschaftslehre nova methodo. Breazeale usefully starts with a general discussion of the development of the idea of Wissenschaftslehre starting with Fichte's first Zurich sketches in 1793-94, then looks at the difficulties the project met regarding its relation to the other, 'applied' branches of philosophy. At the center of the essay, which provides a good overview and summary of the 1796-99 presentation of the Wissenschaftslehre, is the issue of the "method" thematized and actually employed in this work. In short, such a method implies "a combination of (productive) reflection and (passive) observation" (107) and self-observation by the philosopher in order to produce the ongoing presentation of the I's activity. Echoing and transforming a Kantian endeavor, the task of this new version of the Wissenschaftslehre is to offer the "complete inventory of all the transcendental conditions of the possibility of the originally postulated act of empirical consciousness".

Günther Zöller's essay makes its aim clear from the outset: to explore a territory by and large unknown to the "English-speaking reader," who most likely tends to identify Fichte's thought with the 1794-95 Foundations (139). However, the territory mapped out by Zöller' covers much that is still unknown (or not-so-clearly-known) even to the more knowledgeable reader of Fichte, namely, a large body of late work, the critical edition of which has been only recently completed by the Bavarian Academy of Sciences (1962-2012). It is not only the later texts that are less known though. Importantly, Zöller works on framing Fichte's thought after 1800 within the changed philosophical landscape, which now receives its main orientation through Jacobi and Schelling (why is Hegel left out of this picture?). While the literature tends to see in Fichte's late work a decisive turn away from Kant's transcendentalism and subjectivism toward a renewed metaphysical, and even theological, tradition, Zöller suggests a more seamless and complex development informed by a more nuanced reading of Fichte's relation with his predecessors and contemporaries (Schelling in particular).

The third group of essays focuses on Fichte's "applied" philosophy or, rather, the different concrete fields of practical philosophy to which the principles of the Wissenschaftslehre are allegedly applied. In fact, the relationship between these parts of Fichte's philosophy is not as linear and straightforward as one might assume. At stake are the more studied fields of the philosophy of rights and ethics (Allen Wood), the less researched area of political economy and Fichte's theory of property (Jean-Christophe Merle), the philosophy of history (Ives Radrizzani), Fichte's controversial "Addresses to the German Nation" (Alexander Aichele), and the philosophy of religion (Hansjürgen Verweyen).

Wood notes at the outset how moral and ethical concerns, and, above all, the idea of freedom, are the driving forces of Fichte's philosophy from the very beginning (recall Beiser's main claim in this volume) as well as the main inspiration that brings him close to Kant's critical philosophy around 1790. In addition, even with regard to his investigations into the foundations of the philosophical science, Fichte always held that the practical is the foundation of the theoretical (a radicalization of Kant's own idea of the "primacy of the practical" with regard to reason). Wood concentrates on Fichte's two major works, the Foundations of Natural Right (1796-97) and the System of Ethics (1798) which he published immediately after the 1794-95 Foundations, integrating it with a final succinct account of Fichte's later political thought. (Confirming my earlier point that the status of Fichte studies in the Anglo-Saxon world is more advanced today than it was a few decades ago, both books have recently been translated in English, and collective volumes have appeared on their topic). With regard to Fichte's ethical thought, Wood correctly underlines his originality in relation to Kant, even though the debt to Kantian ethics is undeniable, always looming large in the background. He underscores the relation between Fichte's theory of rights and ethics and the first principle of the Wissenschaftslehre, namely, the dependence of both on the absolute freedom and self-determination of the will belonging to the I. With regard to Fichte's Foundations of Natural Right, Wood offers an introductory account of the crucial theme of recognition in the relation of right, of the idea of government (which is distinguished from the law,) and of his contract theory and notion of personal rights. With regard to Fichte's ethics, the difference with his theory of right comes to the fore: the fact that while the latter is intersubjectively oriented (based on recognition and the summons), the theory of ethics is fundamentally centered on the "individual I's striving to actualize its absolute freedom" (187).

Merle's essay is an overview of The Closed Commercial State (1800), a declared "appendix" to the Doctrine of Right in which Fichte expounds his model of political economy. This is a non-utopian, state-directed economy. The concept of property is developed in close connection with the main concepts of the theory of right. In this regard, Merle draws attention to the differences between Kant and Fichte, which are ultimately differences in the concepts of freedom on which their respective notions of property are based. Radrizzani explores Fichte's philosophy of history in writings such as the central Characteristics of the Present Age (1804-05) and the earlier Some Lectures Concerning the Scholar's Vocation (1794). While Fichte meant to offer a systematic exposition of the philosophy of history, he never provided one. At the outset, Radrizzani raises an interesting question that is usually connected to Hegel's philosophy of history. Given that Fichte's task is to complete the system of transcendental philosophy (which, in the view of many post-Kantians, Kant has left incomplete), and that history seems to be constitutively an open-ended (i.e., non-completable) process, "What is the place of history in a system programmatically claiming closure"? The question is even more challenging within the framework of the Wissenschaftslehre, given that it is not obvious that "a philosophy of history" is even "at all possible" (222) within that framework. At stake are the conditions binding a transcendental philosophy of history but also the "engagement" in history -- starting from the dimension of the present and stretching into the future -- that Fichte connects with the project of the Wissenschaftslehre.

Completing the overview of Fichte's philosophy of history is Aichele's account of the Addresses to the German Nation, one of the most controversial among Fichte's later works. The Addresses result from a series of public lectures delivered between December 1807 and March 1808 at the Prussian Academy of Sciences. Aichele frames his discussion with a reading of the Characteristics of the Present Age since it fits within Fichte's late philosophy of history. Moreover, the concept of "absolute state," as well as Fichte's view of the role of the "species" placed above the individual and in radical opposition to it, are central to the Addresses. The idea of a national education (as the education to the standpoint of reason) and the issue of nationalism and "Germanness" (i.e., the uniqueness of the German language and culture and their opposition to what is "foreign" or even to "foreignness" itself) are the problematic concepts that Aichele discusses. He concludes that the "glaring chauvinism" implied in these Fichtean notions does not imply "racism" since "Germanness" is not distinguished from "foreignness" on the basis of biological or ethnic criteria but always with reference to "the one universal reason" (270). However, whether this "one universal reason" is construed by Fichte in terms of "Germanness" seems precisely the crux of the matter here.

Verweyen's discussion of the philosophy of religion concludes the overview of Fichte's applied practical philosophy. He underlines how the relation to religion is one of the earliest themes of Fichte's philosophy, but also one of the earliest topics of his biography. The early and anonymously published Attempt at a Critique of All Revelation (1792) is placed in the context of Kant's philosophy (the young Fichte personally presented the manuscript of this work to Kant in 1791). The Kantian issue of the "postulate" of God is connected with Fichte's attempt to make God something more than a "postulate," and is also connected with Fichte's project of Wissenschaftslehre, i.e., with a different kind of transcendentalism than Kant's. Given that the so-called "Atheism Controversy" is only a few years later, Verweyen raises the question, "Wissenschaftslehre as a temptation to atheism?" (279), and discusses the issue of religion in relation to the 1794-95 Foundations. The later philosophy of religion (an outline of the Instructions for a Blessed Life, or the Doctrine of Religion of 1806) occupies the second half of the essay.

The last four essays focus on issues of reception broadly construed to include Fichte's relationship to his contemporaries and to our own time. The first three offer a counterpart to the volume's opening essays as they progressively enlarge the contemporary constellation in which Fichte's early (Jena) work is placed. Elizabeth Millan considers Fichte's relation to his Romantic peers, particularly his relation to Friedrich Schlegel and Novalis, but she offers a broader and vivid portrait of cultural (literary and philosophical) life in Jena at the turn of the century. (In Hölderlin's words, Fichte was "the soul of Jena".) Her general aim is to challenge and complicate the usual notion of a straightforward influence exercised by Fichte on the early German Romantics. Although Fichte's philosophy does not (at least nominally) contain an "aesthetics," Millan shows how his work is ultimately responsible for shaping "the aesthetic turn that is one of the lasting legacies of early German Romanticism" (308).

Gardner addresses the wavering early relation of Fichte and Schelling, concentrating on the project of the Wissenschaftslehre. He notices from the outset that the point that remains unaltered in this complex relationship is the disagreement concerning "the reality of Nature, denied by Fichte and affirmed by Schelling" (326). Gardner addresses this latter point after giving a careful reading of the history of their philosophical relationship. The horizon is broadened in the next essay. James' topic is the philosophical discussion between Fichte and Hegel in their respective Jena years, culminating, in Hegel's case, with the 1807 Phenomenology of Spirit. James' focus is the much-discussed concept of "recognition" in the phenomenological account of self-consciousness. In this concept, he sees the influence on Hegel of Fichte's own concept of recognition as condition of self-consciousness in the deduction of the concept of right in the Foundations of Natural Right. James concludes with an argument showing how Fichte's and Hegel's idea of the necessity of mutual recognition does not prevent them from justifying slavery under specific conditions.

In the final essay, Paul Franks looks to our contemporary scene and places Fichte in relation to some strands of this discussion, in particular, to the theme of subjectivism vs. anti-subjectivism. While a standard reading of Fichte's thought sees it emerging from Kant's philosophy with the mission of reinforcing its "subjectivism," Franks' aim is to show that, set in relation to the anti-subjectivism of the twentieth century, Fichte's thought can in fact be productively reconstructed as anti-subjectivist.