The Cambridge Companion to Hermeneutics

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Michael N. Forster and Kristin Gjesdal (eds.), The Cambridge Companion to Hermeneutics, Cambridge University Press, 2019, 418pp., $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 9781316638170.

Reviewed by Jens Zimmermann, Trinity Western University


In keeping with the proven structure of Cambridge University Press's well-established, acclaimed companion series, the fifteen compact essays on hermeneutics set his volume apart from its much heftier competitors like the Blackwell Companion to Hermeneutics (71 essays) and the Routledge Companion to Hermeneutics (55 Essays). These earlier publications usually offer segments on the history of hermeneutics from ancient times to the rise of philosophical hermeneutics by focussing on hermeneutic thinkers, covering major key concepts, themes or questions within the framework of hermeneutic philosophy, and then concluding with particular challenges, dialogues or debates important to hermeneutic philosophy. Forster and Gjesdal, the editors, have elected instead to focus on how hermeneutical issues relate to important areas of research in philosophy, literature, history, legal studies and theology, in order to show not only "how central hermeneutical questions across academic fields and divisions, but also how hermeneutics discourse benefits from interdisciplinary and non-partisan approaches" (1). Forster and Gjesdal hope that with this focus on hermeneutical awareness across disciplines "the volume will reach a readership even beyond academia, narrowly speaking, and help to enhance the sensitivity to issues of interpretation in all its manifold forms" (10).

This topical and more general approach would have worked better had Forster and Gjesdal more clearly defined what they mean by hermeneutics. While they provide the briefest roadmap from isolated "forms of hermeneutical thinking" among ancient philosophers to the modern "ambitious philosophical theories of Heidegger and Gadamer, Forster and Gjesdal neither describe this modern development of philosophical hermeneutics nor position their project in relation to it. They should have acknowledged that nowadays "modern hermeneutics" refers to the ontology of understanding developed during the twentieth century in the phenomenological tradition of Husserl, Heidegger, Gadamer, and Ricoeur. Not until Heidegger's hermeneutics of facticity and Gadamer's Truth and Method did we realize, as the editors of the Routledge Companion put it, that "hermeneutics becomes philosophical at the same time as philosophy comes to see itself as hermeneutical." It is only by looking at interpretive practices through the rearview mirror of philosophical hermeneutics that we can say with Forster and Gjesdal that "in its original sense, Hermeneutics is the theory of interpretation and understanding" (1).

From this well-articulated position, Forster and Gjesdal could then have made clear their intent to provide correctives and supplements to the received account of hermeneutics. The essays show convincingly that hermeneutic philosophers like Gadamer are at times guilty of misrepresenting and misconstruing hermeneutic history, as in the case of Romantic figures like Schleiermacher, for example, or that they overlooked important antecedent thinkers like Schlegel, Fichte, and Herder. Yet the reader receives no editorial guidance about the relation of each contribution to philosophical hermeneutics.

Greater historical self-reflexivity in this regard would have allowed the editors to position the chapters more clearly in accordance with the perspectives they offer. To be fair, Forster and Gjesdal deliberately eschew "an exhaustive history of the discipline," and "in-depth accounts of individual theorists," focussing instead on "movements, traditions, and debates" that will confront the reader with "what is at stake in the discipline" of hermeneutics (3). Yet neither the introduction nor the essays provide contours for a coherent discipline of hermeneutics. What the volume actually offers is two chapters that deal with disciplinary exegetical practices and presuppositions (the chapters on biblical hermeneutics and law), while the remaining chapters engage their topics in light of philosophical hermeneutics as represented by thinkers from Heidegger through Gadamer to Ricoeur, offering important corrections mostly to Gadamer's at times one-sided portrayal of hermeneutic history, or relate Gadamer's portrayal of hermeneutics to underappreciated francophone (Michael Forster) or "non-Western interpretive traditions" (Kai Marchal, 287). Hence for most titles, the juxtaposition of a discipline to hermeneutics (all but three chapters are titled "Hermeneutics and [whatever field or topic]") actually signals a relation to philosophical hermeneutics, leaving the few ones without such relation standing awkwardly alone. In fact, "Hermeneutics and Theology" should have been titled "Biblical Hermeneutics" because it says very little about theology and mostly deals with the challenges posed to biblical exegesis by the Enlightenment philosophies of Kant and Lessing.

In short, clearer awareness and articulation of the implicit philosophical framework that governs and structures the contributions would have positioned readers to better appreciate this Companion as the important critique and supplement it offers to the traditional narrative of hermeneutic history. This clarity would have been easily accomplished by turning Kristin Gjesdal's excellent final chapter on "Hermeneutics and the Human Science" into an introductory segment that explains the need to balance Gadamer's well established ontological account of hermeneutics with insights from empirical disciplinary practices so that, in a back and forth movement between philosophical hermeneutic theory and actual empirical work, both sides of the interpretive spectrum are enriched (366-367).

In the absence of a clearly articulated hermeneutic framework for these contributions, the reader has to figure out for herself how each contributor understands the word hermeneutics in relation to his discipline. For Christoph Bultmann, in "Hermeneutics and Theology," hermeneutics clearly means "biblical hermeneutics" (23) in the context of Christian theology. Bultmann starts off well by observing that an approach to biblical hermeneutics has to reflect on the nature of the biblical text. Yet in describing this nature, Bultmann surprisingly excludes features of immense importance to Jewish and Christian theology, like canon formation or views of divine inspiration that mark the text as sacred revelation for a given interpretive community rather than a cultural artifact. The point is not, of course, to champion one particular religious view, but rather to include for a reader interested in a representative portrayal of biblical hermeneutics information on how millions of readers actually approach the text. In fact, any reader conversant with the history of biblical interpretation will be struck by the lack of a fully-orbed theological hermeneutic in these pages.

For example, when rightly highlighting the challenge posed to modern readers by biblical texts about God's wrath on creation (Jeremiah 7:20), Bultmann suggests in a vague understatement that "for a Christian reader," the notion of anger and wrath "will not least be motivated" by the apostle Paul's employing divine wrath "to delineate the background for his proclamation of divine mercy." Oddly enough, the cited passage (Romans 1:18-20) does not mention divine mercy at all. Why does Bultmann not acquaint the reader squarely with Paul's Christological hermeneutic and atonement theology prevalent in the greater Christian tradition? Paul interprets divine wrath, after all, in light of the good news of God's redemptive. More poignantly, Paul re-reads God's dealings with humanity in the light of his conviction that Jesus Christ is the Messiah who reconciles human beings to God and one another.

The same absence of classic Christian theology is apparent in the rest of the chapter, in which Bultmann describes how changing philosophical premises for history and morality among Enlightenment thinkers from Ernesti through Kant, to Spinoza and Lessing, gave rise to historical-critical study of the Bible with an emphasis on philology and comparative religious history. Again, a more fully representative theological overview would mention the postmodern challenges to the secular, rationalist views of history, nature, and language that prop up modernity's biblical hermeneutics. At least since the 1930s, scholars like Henri de Lubac, Jean Daniélou, or, more recently Frances Young and, in a more theological vein, Rowan Williams and John Milbank (to name only a few) have pointed out the disputable metaphysical decisions behind the historical-critical school. It is strange and disappointing to find none of these developments mentioned in a companion designed to introduce readers to current themes and issues in hermeneutics.

Happily, the remaining articles fare much better in this regard. In "Hermeneutics of Nature," Dalia Nassar, countering Gadamer's one-sided hermeneutic history (59 n9), argues for a "hermeneutics of nature" in thinkers like Buffon, Diderot, and, above all, Herder who liberated science from a mere mathematical objectivist paradigm (38). These thinkers already knew that natural history requires literary tools like analogy, and integrative structures like Herder's "circle or world" that integrates human or animal capacities with environmental influences in constructing a developmental natural history. Nassar's piece indeed provides an important corrective to Gadamer's narrative, but one could have wished that a scholar of Nassar's stature would acknowledge Herder's metaphysical, indeed, religious conviction that natural history, including that of language, depends on divinely guided teleology of biological evolution. Based on this belief, he can say, for example, that "the human origin of language shows God in the greatest light" because it shows how the human soul "as image of [God's] being" develops language.

In "Hermeneutics and Romanticism," Fred Rush undertakes to recover Romantic hermeneutics as represented by Schlegel, Schleiermacher, and Humboldt, from their distortive representation in Gadamer's account. We learn that "empathy has no role in Schlegel's hermeneutics," and that he already advocates "an open-ended dialogic process" of understanding that is bounded by language (73-74), and that Schleiermacher's view of interpretation was as holistic and language oriented as Gadamer's. (Rush would do well to extend this holism also to Schleiermacher's faith formation which was not "Lutheran" but Lutheran-Reformed, or as Schleiermacher puts it in the preface to The Christian Faith, "evangelical" and "protestant" in uniting Lutheran and Reformed traditions). This otherwise valuable contribution is marred by its polemic premise that, unlike the Romantics, "the Heidegger acolyte" Gadamer "sacrifices objectivity" by "placing the primary value of understanding [on] the self-transformation of the interpreting agent," rather than on "understanding the other" (67). This reading of Gadamer is even more simplistic than Gadamer's own reading of the Romantics Rush seeks to correct. Gadamer, after all, criticizes Heidegger for not incorporating an I-Thou dynamic into his ontology, and clearly models his own theory of understanding through tradition on the personal encounter with another "who has something to say to me" (Truth and Method, 355). As Gadamer argues in a later essay, Heidegger's philosophy lacks the insight that self-knowledge is possible only through encountering another as the transcendent limit of myself.

Thankfully, the reader can find a more adequate summary of Heidegger's contribution to philosophical hermeneutics and the main elements he contributes to Gadamer's theory of understanding in Benjamin Crowe's "Hermeneutics and Phenomenology." Crow succinctly and carefully summarizes the early Heidegger's hermeneutics of facticity and their influence on Gadamer's philosophical hermeneutics. One could wish that other contributors had consulted Crowe's careful exegesis before making rash claims about Heidegger's subjectivism or Gadamer's supposed uncritical acceptance of an organically unfolding tradition, or of advancing "a master discourse of the human sciences" that relegates any methodologically reliant models of knowledge to "ahistorical proceduralism" (Gjedsal, 362-363). Crowe clearly demonstrates Heidegger's ambivalent depiction of tradition as making "things familiar to us and available to us, [while] it also obscures and occludes, forecloses possibilities" (221). Likewise Crowe shows that Gadamer does not deride method, but warns against "overly naive reliance on method for achieving the 'correct' understanding" of phenomena (227). This is the kind of chapter exemplary for the accurate, and helpful guidance Cambridge Companions provide for readers.

In "Hermeneutics and Idealism," the well-known scholar of German Idealism Paul Redding fills in an often neglected part of hermeneutic history with his portrait of German idealism at the end of the 18th century that followed in the wake of Kant's critique of pure reason. Redding describes central figures like Hamann, Herder, Fichte, and Hegel as a "fractious family," whose polemics testified to the common goal of purging Kant's attempt to overcome rationalism of its own lingering rationalist remnants (87). These debates centered on the relation of language to human thought and action. Within this family, Hamann and Herder emerge as early champions of linguistically determined thought, while Fichte only comes around later to recognizing the important influence of language on thought. Even Hegel, Redding suggests, when examined on the relation of language to thought, comes across as more a hermeneutic thinker than traditionally assumed.

John H. Zammito's "Hermeneutics and History", is a splendid manifesto on historiography. He grounds it in a retrieval of what he considers to be the two most important German thinkers on historiography, Johann Gustav Droysen and Herder, and urges historians to drop any remaining positivist urges and conduct history hermeneutically. History as a discipline, he concludes, "is to embrace hermeneutics in its empirical inquiry" without falling into either positivism or any attempts at reliving events in the present. This article is exemplary for what a companion to hermeneutics should accomplish. Zammito provides historical background on historiography and then shows how a hermeneutic conception of history, based on the pathbreaking work on historical research by thinkers whom we normally situate within the hermeneutic tradition, above all Herder, but also Schleiermacher, Dilthey, and then the exemplary historian Droysen. While Gadamer viewed most of these thinkers as problematic, Zammito presents them as progenitors of a "hermeneutical historicism" (127) beyond the confining oppositions of positivism and relativism that have dogged all attempts to justify history as science. According to Zammito, historical research is about "understanding" brought about by the creative act of synthesizing empirical evidence of historical artifacts into a coherent narrative inspired by current concerns. He stresses the role of an informed, creative imagination, but an imagination "harnessed to interpretation" based on empirical evidence and thus not an imagination "unleashed to fantasy" (126). With this article, the volume really gets going! Teachers of history would do well to recommend this chapter as standard reading in their courses.

In "Hermeneutics and Positivism", Frederick C. Beiser provides more support for Zammito's argument by dismantling positivist caricatures of understanding or what he calls "the bogeyman" of empathetic understanding (139). Beiser shows that this caricature relies on a dualist metaphysics of scientific positivism that has to oppose explanation of history by universal laws (or covering law theory) to understanding events via a form of empathy. He argues that we don't have to choose between the empirical and the mental realm when we realize, with Max Weber, that understanding an action of the past "involves a hypothetical reconstruction of the agent's reasoning," in a way that does not "conflate interpretation with causal explanation" (154). Following Weber, Beiser hopes, would help us finally leave behind the silly competition between continental and analytic philosophy.

Sebastian Gardner examines the relation between "Hermeneutics and Psychoanalysis" with reference to Habermas and Paul Ricoeur. In "Hermeneutics and Critical Theory," Georgia Warnke helpfully rehearses Habermas' suggested application of Freudian psychoanalysis to Gadamer's hermeneutics in order to detect dehumanizing elements in tradition a concern, she helpfully shows, shared by Axel Honneth who worries about Gadamer's alleged trust in immediate experience (254). Gardner's conclusion that Freud may point us to a deeper understanding of "how meaning bleeds all the way down into nature" gestures toward the importance of combining natural science and hermeneutics, but takes too little account of Ricoeur's substantive preparatory work on this point in The Voluntary and Involuntary.

Three other chapters discuss philosophical hermeneutics in relation to Nietzsche, to Law, and to Literature. Paul Katsafanas shows how Nietzsche, while not promulgating a hermeneutic theory, nonetheless anticipates main aspects of the hermeneutic tradition because "he rejects immediate givens, endorses holism and perspectivism, and sees conscious experience as structured by concepts and language" (180). Ralf Poscher argues that hermeneutics can learn much more from the practice of law than an intrinsic applicatory dimension of interpretation as Gadamer claimed. In delineating distinct aspects of legal practice, Poscher claims to restore an analytical dimension to interpretation that reveals a more complex structure of hermeneutics glossed over by Gadamer, who wrongly opposed Betti's important distinction between meaning and significance (346). Jonathan Culler, with his customary clarity, wonders whether philosophical hermeneutics is of any value to literary criticism. What can a theory of understanding offer? He concludes that "perhaps literary studies would be better served by a special hermeneutics, or a dialectic of hermeneutics and poetics [the study of literary structures]" (321). Like other contributions, Culler's reflections suffer from the unwarranted fear that philosophical hermeneutics implies relativism. He wonders, for example, whether Gadamer would even recognize the distinction between valid interpretations from invalid ones (316), a worry that could have been allayed through acquaintance with Gadamer's concept of double mimesis that requires faithful re-presencing of an object through interpretive performance.

The respective chapters by Forster and Kai Marchal round off the volume by describing often neglected "Francophone Approaches" and "Non-Western Approaches" to hermeneutics. Marchal points out important analogies between Western and still evolving Asian hermeneutic theories with particular attention to Chinese traditions. He notes that "the question of language, problems of understanding, meaning, finitude, and temporality" are all discussed in non-Western texts, even if they are conceived differently (298).

Forster argues that "the very roots of German hermeneutics turn out to have been largely French," because French thought first promulgated the critique of universalism "concerning beliefs, concepts, values, [and] sensations" on which hermeneutic theory depends (261). Moreover, Forster shows how French semiology of the kind offered by Roland Barth deepens Gadamerian accounts of linguisticality, although one cannot help but think that in this instance Forster's critical zeal has not unfairly reduced Gadamer's notion of Sprache to verbal communication. Indeed, one wonders at times what motivates Forster's preference of some hermeneutic thinkers over others. His characterization of Ricoeur, for example, seems oddly prejudiced when claiming that Ricoeur's "philosophical program is not very philosophically attractive." Ricoeur, Forster notes, rehashing a common cliché, rightly gives up "Gadamer's reverence for tradition" but fails to talk about "discourse and art." Really? What should we make, then, of Ricoeur's statement in Interpretation Theory: Discourse and the Surplus of Meaning (1976) in which he declares that "the theory of discourse [!] in the first essay governs all the subsequent developments of my interpretation theory" (72)? And indeed, is there any kind of discourse (historical, poetic, rhetorical, religious, sociological, scientific, philosophical, etc.) Ricoeur has not commented on during his long career?

Forster also charges Ricoeur with the unforgivable sin of inserting "religion into hermeneutics," setting him apart from earlier theorists like Herder and Schleiermacher who, "although, like Ricoeur, both Protestant believers, had the good sense to keep religious assumptions out of interpretation" (267). Forster's evidence for this claim is Ricoeur's assumption that one must "believe [the Bible] in order to understand it," a claim Schleiermacher "emphatically denies" (281 n.19). Leaving aside the fact that in Forster's cited passage Ricoeur actually describes Bultmann's position rather than his own, should not a hermeneutics scholar like Forster understand that neither Herder nor Schleiermacher kept religious presuppositions out of interpretation, but rather operate using different religious presuppositions than Ricoeur's about how God interacts with the world and with the church? When Schleiermacher wrote that the divine inspiration of the Bible "does not prohibit any other book to be or become also a Bible," he had simply widened the hermeneutical circle based on his religious conviction of universal God-consciousness. Ricoeur, who told everyone who did not want to hear about it that he was a philosopher rather than a theologian, insisted nonetheless that philosophy ought to be open to religion to avoid curtailing valid human experience. Not bad advice, one would think.

The Companion concludes with Gjesdal's "Hermeneutics and the Human Sciences." Gjesdal most clearly articulates the opposition that informs a number of the contributions, namely the contrast between Gadamer's "ontological hermeneutics" and an "empirically informed approach" she locates in the "Herder-Schleiermacher-Dilthey" lineage (367). It is ironic that in making this distinction, she worries about Gadamer's opposition between truth and method, one he never made and strenuously denied, eternally regretting the title his publisher  chose for his book on hermeneutic philosophy. It is also odd that Gjesdal never mentions Ricoeur, who saw much of his work as providing a neglected (but not opposed) empirical, linguistic analysis to Gadamer's "short cut" of ontological claims about human understanding.

Gjedsal's main concern stands for the central problem this Companion fails clearly to articulate. Her central worry is that Gadamer's ontological focus "in sublating specific disciplinary discussions into circular hermeneutical mode" effectively wipes out an objective dimension offered by "an empirically informed approach" that would provide critical leverage for Gadamer's universal claim (336-337). Her concern for an empirical dimension draws attention to the one glaring gap in the Companion's offerings: there is no chapter on science and hermeneutics that considers the work of Michael Polanyi or Joseph Kockelmans. Returning to the issue at hand: Indeed, Gjesdal's worry about objectivity has dogged philosophical hermeneutics from the beginning, a discussion the editors should have taken up in the introduction to avoid begging the question. As many philosophers who are not simply Heideggerian-Gadamerian disciples have pointed out, opposing ontological and empirical theories of knowledge is itself symptomatic of modernity's reductive epistemology that goes back to Cartesian substance dualism. Only a post-Cartesian mind severed from being distrusts our embodied cognition to convey objective truth through a full range of human experience mediated by traditional ways of seeing. If the separation of mind from being is indeed our modern problem, then some form of participatory ontology of the kind suggested by philosophical hermeneutics is the solution. The point is not to pit ontological against empirical theories of knowledge, but to understand what kind of understanding is commensurate with each area of human experience. Guiding us in this endeavor is what one should expect from a good Companion on this important journey.