Readers looking for a fight, or the next round of an on-going fight, will not find it here. And by “here” I mean to refer both to the book under review and this review itself. In just the past six years there have been at least a dozen books published on Strauss and Straussians,1 on the work of the thinker and on the politics of his putative influence over his students. A student of philosophy who somehow missed the entirety of the past decade might pick up Smith’s collection of essays and see nothing more than a standard, rigorous academic treatment of a philosopher in the Cambridge Series. Yet anyone who has paid even scant attention to the recent literature would see something else as well: a careful and purposive choice to avoid rehashing the debate between, on the one hand, those who wish to draw the link between Strauss and neoconservatism and/or the Iraq War and, on the other, those who wish to break that connection, to defend Strauss (and sometimes, but not always, his students as well) from those charges.
Instead, and keeping well with the mission statement of the Cambridge Companion to Philosophy series — to overcome “intimidation” and “serve as a reference for students and non specialists” — Smith has assembled a very sober volume. As Smith says in his lucid and succinct introduction, he has brought together the ten essays in the volume (plus his intro and his own brief biographical overview of Strauss’s life and work, for a total of 12 chapters) in order “to canvass the wide range of Strauss’s interests” (6). Some might question whether the term “wide-ranging” can aptly be applied to the group of contributing authors, most of whom are either self-identified Straussians, students of Strauss, or scholars who have taught or studied at the University of Chicago. Yet I use this passive construction not to smuggle in my own criticism on this front, but rather to displace it. Many recent works on Strauss and contemporary politics have become caught up in a hopeless and seemingly endless process of name calling, and I have no interest in playing that game. More importantly, it should not come as a surprise that when faced with the editorial task of finding experts on Strauss to contribute to an edited volume, Smith would wind up choosing many individuals who fall into one of these three groups. Finally, Smith has, in fact, brought together a wide array of approaches to Strauss – including some criticisms. More importantly, the book proves broad in terms of themes (from the problem of modernity, to religion and reason, to social science method, to political regimes), time periods (from early writings and letters, some still not translated into English, through the well-known and widely-read books, to late essays and spoken remarks), and approaches (some authors treat Strauss as a scholar and actor in his own right, some take him as a teacher, and some address him as a philosopher engaging with timeless questions).
Philosophy Between Religion and Politics
As presented, the volume has no explicit structure other than the 12 chapters, but it divides well into three sections: the first includes Smith’s two framing chapters; the second includes the next five chapters, all of which center on questions of Strauss’s engagement with ancient, medieval, and modern philosophy, dealing in particular with the modern/premodern divide and the question of reason and religion; the final section is comprised of five chapters that engage more with questions of politics and society and includes two chapters focusing directly on politics, two on social science and liberal education, and a final chapter on the very practical and historical issue of “”SpellE">Straussians." Smith’s chapters are introductory overviews, of course, but they perform the task admirably and will, I think, provide an excellent resource in years to come both for those approaching Strauss’s works for the first time and for longer-term readers of Strauss who want a clear and definitive source. Each of the next two sections appears front-loaded, with some of the more important, controversial or new material coming in the earlier chapters.
If these twelve distinct essays can be said to come together under a single unifying theme or idea (and perhaps they cannot), then it is certainly that of “Strauss as philosopher.” In particular, Strauss emerges here most clearly as a philosopher who navigates the pre-modern/modern divide. Numerous authors take up the challenge of re-describing Strauss’s critique of modernism, while others take on the task of showing Strauss’s relation to premodern philosophical principles and approaches. In Strauss’s own terms, philosophy was the best answer to the most important question asked by the ancient Greek thinkers: what is the best way of life? Philosophy responds so well to the question precisely because the philosophical way of life is one of questioning, one of pursuing a truth that can never be grasped, never answered. But the philosophical pursuit of what Strauss fondly and consistently referred to as “knowledge of the whole” — to be distinguished from the merely instrumental knowledge of facts and data within the epistemological terms of modernity — proved consistently fraught. Philosophy is threatened on the one side by a politics that would destroy it (3, 33) and on the other by a set of religious principles that would replace its search for knowledge with the positive content of revelation (115, 174). Few readers of this volume will be surprised to hear about the first threat, given the familiarity of the example — Socrates’s death at the hands of the Athenian demos. Most readers will also be acquainted with readings of Strauss that suggest he dealt with the second threat either by rejecting religious dogma (as an atheist himself) or by allowing and subtly encouraging the religious takeover (as a religious believer himself).
In one of the stronger pieces in the volume, perhaps especially for those who are not close readers of Strauss’s entire body of work, Leora Batnitzky demonstrates the inadequacies of each of these responses. All the biographical evidence indicates (and there is a wealth of such materials cited in this volume, one of the effects of which is to thoroughly humanize Strauss the man2) that Strauss was a non-believing Jew, an atheist who early in life embraced a strictly political zionism (43). While Strauss obviously understood the role that religious principles played in supporting social order, there is simply little reason to take him as a religious believer. Using a phrase of Strauss’s from his later writings, Batnitzky shows that Strauss’s entire corpus holds together in the way that it grapples with the “theological-political predicament.” This phrase names the competing claims of philosophy and religion. Of course, Strauss, many of his students, and most of the contributors to this volume like to refer to philosophy and religion under the de-historicized titles of “reason and revelation” and they often point to the “theological-political predicament” under the name “the problem of Jerusalem and Athens” (36). The shift to “reason and revelation” serves to indicate that this conflict is not institutional, not reducible to a particular historical battle, while the latter naming technique ironically situates this universal problem within a particular Western context. The West thus becomes the non-place where universal questions are asked and answered.
Those who see reason and history differently would very likely challenge the framing of this predicament by Strauss and his readers; nonetheless, numerous chapters in this volume use such a framing to clarify and illuminate a great deal of Strauss’s overall project.3 To see Strauss’s project as a response to this predicament is to understand why, despite his consistent and sometimes virulent critique of modern philosophy (e.g. 52, 129), Strauss never sought a wholesale return to the pre-modern. The general argument, that Strauss does not simply or literally wish to return to ancient Philosophy, is repeated by numerous authors (7, 41-42, 93, 117, 173), but Catherine Zuckert makes this case most forcefully in her subtle exploration of the way in which Strauss returns to premodern thought. She quotes Strauss’s most important statement on this issue: “only we living today can possibly find a solution to the problems of today” (117).
The choice of how one interprets Strauss’s own negotiation of the theological-political predicament tells readers a great deal about his positions on key issues in political theory. As most contributors to this volume read Strauss, he saw the conflict between reason and revelation as irresolvable because the positions from which they argue are incommensurable. Revelation can be neither supported by nor blended with reason; this was the main problem Strauss identified in medieval philosophy, especially Thomism (58). Nor, however, can the former be refuted by the latter; this was potentially a problem for the earlier, perhaps more dogmatically atheistic Strauss who was tempted by this possibility, before later recognizing the complete incompatibility of the two. Indeed, it is Strauss’s later understanding of the fundamental importance of these two “roots of western civilization” (94), that reveals him fully — according to most of the contributors here — as a thoroughly non-dogmatic philosopher who believes in no universal moral standards, no singular truth. Smith emphasizes this perhaps unexpected or controversial point (one that certainly cuts against the grain of many criticisms of Strauss) when he insists that there is nothing absolutist about Strauss’s thought, and that his “return to nature” was a return to “flexible” standards (33). Furthermore, a number of chapters emphasize Strauss’s “”SpellE">zetetic" understanding of philosophy as quest for truth, but never knowledge or possession of it (146, 183); Michael Zuckert even uses the “”SpellE">zetetic" category as one to help distinguish between the various Straussian “camps” (274-275).
Some readers may balk at the picture of a Strauss with flexible standards, as a skeptical thinker, as one who returned to a “nature” in premodern thought that was not fixed and eternal. But those readers are well-advised to engage closely with the readings in this volume, with the work of Strauss, and perhaps also with the writings of the classic political philosophers that Strauss and his followers have championed. After all, the tension between the skeptical, questioning pursuit of knowledge as that which we can never possess, and the dogmatic claim to have such knowledge is surely the tension between (one reading of) Socratic elenchus and (one reading of) the Platonic eidos. But even if we take Strauss to have had no telos, no knowledge of the “truth of the whole” that he relentlessly presupposed and pursued, there seems much less doubt about his certitude when it comes to the enemy he fought: nihilism.
Susan Shell quotes Strauss to define nihilism as: “‘a desire to destroy the present world and its potentialities’ unaccompanied by the clear conception of any positive alternatives” (176). More important, perhaps, than Strauss’s consistent opposition to nihilism was his repeated encountering of it in both modern philosophy and modern society. It is hard not to agree with Strauss’s opposition to nihilism, given his very definition of it, but in addition to this understanding of nihilism Strauss repeatedly described for his readers a chain of logic that always inevitably leads to nihilism: historicism leads to relativism, leads to nihilism. And thus, while nihilism is the rhetorical enemy, historicism is the practical, on-the-ground opponent. Smith puts it this way on just the second page of the book: “Strauss showed how modernity exhibited a dangerous tendency toward ‘historicism’ or what became known as ‘nihilism’, that is, the view that all standards of justice and morality are historically relative” (2). This is an important formulation: first, because it contains the common sign chain historicism-nihilism-relativism (ultimately, they are really all the same), and second, because Smith here asserts as proven by Strauss precisely what Strauss so frequently simply asserts, that to historicize is to render everything relative, is to “desire to destroy” the world.4
While many contributors to this volume do indeed take it that historicism (because it leads to nihilism) is a danger or threat that must be responded to
- and therefore that “historicist” authors like Heidegger pose their own dangers as well - Stanley Rosen’s chapter challenges Strauss on just this point. Rosen characterizes Strauss’s argument against historicism/relativism as resting on this logic: “if everything changes its nature then there is no nature” and if there is no nature then there is no genuine knowledge at all (124). Rosen questions Strauss’s logic: “the claim that everything is historical is not equivalent to the claim that everything is permissible” (124). Rosen points to Nietzsche’s thought of “eternal return” as suggesting just this possibility. But I think Nietzsche’s conception of “”SpellE">perspectivism" poses the most direct alternative Strauss’s view. For Nietzsche it is possible to have a view of the better (a better reading, for example, or a better action in the sense that it is more life-affirming) without a view of the best. This is precisely what Strauss sees as impossible: for Strauss, the quest for knowledge cannot merely be a knowledge of particulars but must in fact be knowledge of “the whole.” The key to navigating the difference between Strauss’s position and that of Nietzsche, or anyone else who affirms the possibility of knowledge as a historical product, depends on how one understands the relation of part to whole.5 And this brings us to the question of interpretation.
It can only be understatement to call the question of interpretation a thorny one in the case of Strauss. In general, when faced with the task of bringing together disparate essays all on a single author (i.e., the task of editing a volume like this one) the question of approach must always either be: a) answered at the outset of the book; b) engaged with directly within the volume; or, c) displaced to haunt the text. Festschrift and critical volumes prime the question of interpretive approach in their own particular ways, as does, in this instance, the series description. In the case of a volume on Strauss the stakes are multiplied, and Smith therefore faces an even greater challenge.
Smith can safely start with the obvious: Strauss’s most explicit statement on interpretive method, “Persecution and the Art of Writing,” also stands as his most famous piece of writing (27). While it is well known that Strauss claimed to have “rediscovered” the ancient art of “esoteric” writing,6 this volume clarifies an important related point: precisely this rediscovery led Strauss to his own personal revolution in thought. Strauss’s most well known, widely read, and harshly criticized books were all written after Strauss developed his own unique hermeneutics. This volume also places that development/discovery into its rarely discussed historical context. Most readers know that Strauss was a Jewish German émigré who came to the United States between the wars and went on to have a long career as a famous University of Chicago professor. But they may not be aware that between Freiburg and Chicago Strauss spent a year in Paris, a year in London, two years in Cambridge, and then he lived more than a decade of his life in New York City.
Smith says that in New York “Strauss became a ”SpellE">Straussian" (27).7 And in New York, Strauss stumbled, in a way, upon esotericism. One of the little jewels of this collection, especially for those not already well steeped in the secondary literature on Strauss, is the exegesis by Laurence Lampert (and the summary by Smith and others) of the letters Strauss wrote to Jacob Klein in 1938 and 1939. These letters, only recently published in German and still untranslated into English, show clearly that Strauss did not develop his hermeneutics independently of his own readings, but truly did “discover” it in the sense that he came upon a way to make sense of a text that, for Strauss, was previously mysterious or full of contradictions. In the first letter that Lampert quotes, Strauss tells Klein that “Maimonides is getting more and more exciting” (63) and from this point on Strauss’s excitement only builds, with each letter more full of thrill than the previous one. Strauss is thrilled because for him Maimonides makes sense when one sees that “Maimonides in his beliefs was ”“>absolutely no Jew” (64, emphasis in original) and therefore he cannot be read as a “Jewish philosopher” writing a guide for believers. He must be read, instead, as a non-believer, writing a “radical critique of the Torah” that sounds to believers as if it is merely a repetition of the Torah, yet which adds “‘little’ ‘additions’” to signal to a few select readers (philosophers) what the text is really all about (65). Strauss’s better-known and (as Smith notes) much maligned theory of esoteric writing is contained in this kernel of insight (3). Philosophers like Maimonides who write under conditions of persecution (conditions in which to state plainly the truth in the face of dominant opinion would be to court disaster) must therefore produce texts that contain within them two very much distinct and at times utterly contradictory meanings. This then sets up the requirements for how good readers, those that Strauss refers to with an ambiguity that some might find ominous as “the few,” will read.
They will distinguish between the true teaching as the esoteric teaching and the socially useful teaching as the exoteric teaching; whereas the exoteric teaching is meant to be easily accessible to every reader, the esoteric teaching discloses itself only to very careful and well-trained readers after long and concentrated study. (Strauss, WPP, 221-2).
This quote contains the crux of the Strauss’s rediscovery of esotericism — the path that then led Strauss to reread Plato and many others as esoteric writers
- and it includes some of the elements that most worry nonStraussians about that hermeneutic approach. One problem with esoteric writing as a general theory of interpretation is that it becomes very difficult to know when to take an author at his or her word. Thus, my telling you that I have not written this review esoterically may in fact be the secret signal I give to a certain few readers that I am in fact writing esoterically, and to indicate to them that they should make sure to read me as such. Indeed, on Lampert’s interpretation of him, this is precisely what Strauss does in his essay on Halevi. This example gives, at one and the same time, both a powerful illustration of the multiple-layered and sophisticated nature of esotericism while it also points to the potential dangers and internal contradictions of the theory.
Here are the steps of the various readings, starting with Halevi’s text and then moving to Strauss’s reading of Halevi and Lampert’s reading of Strauss.
1) Halevi omits a discussion of the conflict between believer and philosopher.
2A) Strauss says the omission is intentional, designed to show esoterically that this conflict is exactly what matters most. (78)
2B) But Strauss then goes on to say that we should not “lay too much emphasis on this line of approach” (79).
3) Lampert then argues that this last line is Strauss’s esoteric claim: “to not lay too much emphasis on this approach is to take this approach” (79).
To sum up, Halevi omits what is, in fact, most important; Strauss downplays what is, in fact, most significant. But if we know that Halevi is writing esoterically (and can only interpret him properly because of this knowledge) and if we know Strauss is also writing esoterically in his interpretation (ditto), then we therefore know how to read Strauss on Halevi.
Fair enough. But what do we know about Lampert? Or about me? That is, Strauss’s reading locates “two parts” or two meanings in Halevi’s text: the exoteric omission and the esoteric significance of that omission. Lampert then goes on to locate the two parts — as I have tried to emphasize in my “2A” and “2B” labeling above — in Strauss’s reading (the exoteric downplaying of importance and the esoteric significance of that very gesture). My question “what about ”SpellE">Lampert" can be expanded and specified: is there a second part, a “3B” to accompany the “3A” above, to Lampert’s reading? If there is in fact a “3B,” then I would need to offer an interpretation of Lampert that located that part, i.e., that specified the esoteric meaning (and therefore, in general, delineated the esoteric nature) of Lampert’s text. Moreover, it would then be incumbent upon you, my reader, to specify the two parts of my reading
- call them “4A” and “4B.” If every esoteric reading also becomes an esoteric writing, then how does one avoid an infinite regress, wherein every interpretation of an esoteric text must call for a future (esoteric) interpretation of itself?
One could try to hold the line, to stop the regress, by showing that this volume itself, precisely because it reveals directly the insights of esoteric writing - through the exegesis of Strauss’s letters of 1938-1939 to anyone who reads the text, and not just to Straussians
- brings the esotericism to a stop. Nonetheless, the message of esoteric writing requires that I immediately question this preceding claim. How would I know that the direct articulation of the content and approach of the esoteric interpretation of texts is not itself the exoteric teaching of Strauss? If it were then the esoteric meaning would be something other, perhaps very much the opposite. And how can I, as a reader of a secondary source on Strauss, discern the difference between Strauss’s own exoteric arguments and the esoteric exegesis of those arguments?8 Many of the contributors to this volume discuss Strauss’s “rediscovery of esotericism,” and there are powerful arguments here to show how this hermeneutics leads Strauss to some of his most important claims within political theory. But aside from Lampert, who criticizes Strauss, very few authors here deal with these broader implications of the theory of esotericism.
A Return to Strauss?
Any decent review should give its reader an answer to the most fundamental question of the genre: namely, should you read this book? Given that this is a rigorous and well researched academic volume that both provides an introduction to, and an overview of, a major figure in philosophy, while also adding to the extant secondary literature on that thinker, then in this case, the question transforms into another, much larger and thornier one. Should we read Strauss? Shadia Drury’s project seems to be designed to prove to us that we should not. By trying to draw as direct a line as possible between Strauss’s political theory and the politics of neoconservative regime change, Drury treats Strauss’s thought as somehow “dangerous” in itself, as if the goal of her work consisted not so much in interrogating or challenging Strauss’s ideas, but in locating Strauss in a political position that appears to be both the opposite of Drury’s and mostly untenable.9
There can be no doubt that the very existence of a volume on Strauss in the Cambridge Companion to Philosophy series argues very forcefully (even if indirectly) for reading Strauss. And obviously the contributors to this volume all make out a small piece of the case for reading Strauss. Ultimately, I might be said to write a concurring opinion: I agree wholeheartedly with the majority that Strauss should be read, but I myself might read him for very different reasons than those provided by the authors of the chapters in this volume. Perhaps like them, I think we should read Strauss because he was, indeed, a brilliant and engaged thinker and because he most certainly demonstrated a dazzling ability to interpret difficult and subtle texts in the history of political thought. But more importantly, and unlike the contributors this volume, I think we should continue to read Strauss precisely because he ultimately defended a set of philosophical (and often political) principles with which I disagree profoundly.
Thus, to me it seems not only problematic but also somewhat naive to say, as some critics of Strauss have been saying over the past decade, that Strauss defended authoritarian politics. Strauss himself certainly did not do so in any obvious way, and many authors here argue strongly against this position. Chief among them are William Galston and Steven Smith, who both make the case for Strauss as quite genuinely “a friend of liberal democracy” (Strauss’s line). Put simply, if the debate is “Strauss for tyranny, pro or con?” I come down on the side of Smith, Galston, and the Straussians. For this very reason, however, I think we should resist the narrow framing of the debate that has been provided by those opponents of Strauss, like Drury, who seem to think his work has no merit whatsoever. For in either calling Strauss a tyrant of sorts, or in making the case for Strauss’s support of liberal democracy, a very great deal is left out.
And, in a manner that sounds almost like an esoteric reading (but doesn’t require double meanings) what is missing here proves very significant. For regardless of whether he was a “friend” of “liberal democracy,” there can be little doubt that Strauss never defended or supported democracy as such; indeed, as Galston shows, Strauss praised modern liberal democracy precisely for the ways in which it was more aristocratic than ancient democracy (199). Further, while Strauss never clearly defended authoritarian politics, he did clearly argue against both egalitarianism and any radical sense of equality (203). Moreover, Strauss felt certain that only a few were fit for the life of philosophy that he championed, and he therefore argued fairly directly that philosophy must be protected from the many who are simply unfit for it as a way of life. For this reason, much of Strauss’s political philosophy seems designed to make sure that philosophy can continue to exist, but precisely as a private and sheerly pedagogical affair (85, 150).
Those who disagree with Strauss on issues such as philosophy, democracy, and equality will need to make an argument against Strauss. They will need to show why being a friend of liberal democracy is not enough, which requires, in turn, articulating and defending principles or arguments for democracy (perhaps a radical variant) and equality (perhaps beyond liberalism’s terms). And they will need to make the case for a philosophy that does not turn in on itself but rather continually makes its way back to the city. To address Strauss’s political philosophy is one way among many, but perhaps an important way, to make this case. For this task, among many others, Strauss must be read, and this book offers a good place to start reading him.
1 In a chapter devoted entirely to the category “”SpellE">Straussians," Michael Zuckert defines a Straussian as follows: “one who works to a degree that cannot be entirely specified within a framework of Strauss’s question and chief concepts, and, if the scholar in question is concerned with textual studies, deploys Strauss’s methods of close reading” (164). For the purposes of this review, I am concerned mainly with Strauss’s life and writings as discussed by the contributors to this volume; therefore I use the label only occasionally, and mostly when it has already been brought up by one of those contributors.
2 The most ardent antiStraussian will find it hard not to pause at Smith’s account of a 38-year-old Strauss, scratching by on a very meager income in New York City, who writes a letter to his friend expressing both his thrill at teaching his first seminar (“It really happened!” exclaims Strauss) and then goes on to share the ubiquitous insecurities of the teacher (“But I am a charlatan. I asserted a thousand things that didn’t add up or that I didn’t know anything about” 25).
3 That group of thinkers who understand the relation between reason and history differently from Strauss proves vast. Over the years, Strauss attached the label “historicist” to the vast majority of modern philosophers, to almost all of twentieth century social science, and to a variety of positions in contemporary political theory. Here I seek neither to legitimate Strauss’s categorization nor to defend those thinkers. My point is simply that taking Strauss’s work as a response to the theological-philosophical problem serves to clarify some of the stakes of the debate between Strauss and those he would call historicist.
4 In some texts of Strauss this desire and logic manifests itself in the example of cannibalism; i.e., to historicize is to render everything relative is to see nothing wrong with cannibalism. See Strauss, “Progress or Return” in Ten Essays by Leo Strauss (Detroit: Wayne State UP, 1989), p. 269; Cf. Thomas Pangle, The Rebirth of Classical Political Rationalism (Chicago: U. of Chicago Press, 1989), p. 9.
5 For Strauss, the very idea of knowledge as a historical product is an historicist notion that undermines or rejects a genuine pursuit of knowledge as quest for the whole. However, many within the large group of thinkers who understand knowledge as produced in history also contend that one can abandon the pursuit of “knowledge of the whole” without thereby giving up entirely on knowledge, reason, or truth (the abandonment of which would surely lead to nihilism).
6 Strauss makes clear that he does not invent this mode of writing; as Lampert puts it, Strauss sought to “”“>restore esotericism” (76). The overall theory rests on the essential idea that a work contains two meanings, exoteric and esoteric, but there is some confusion over how to refer to a work that contains both meanings. Lampert suggests that Strauss technically called such works “exoteric,” but in any case the convention has been established to refer to such writings as “esoteric works” and to refer to the general theory as that of “esoteric writing.” I too follow that convention here.
8 In addition to this central problem, we also encounter what I would call the second order effects of esoteric writing/interpreting: namely, the radical divide between one group of readers and another — a divide that can, in turn, lead to a certain insider/outsider status and even to secret societies trading the secrets of secret readings.