The Cambridge Companion to Locke's "Essay Concerning Human Understanding"

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Lex Newman (ed.), The Cambridge Companion to Locke's "Essay Concerning Human Understanding", Cambridge University Press, 2007, 486pp., $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521542258.

Reviewed by Raffaella De Rosa, Rutgers University


John Locke's Essay Concerning Human Understanding (1689) occupies a prominent position not only among the texts of early modern philosophy but of philosophy of all times. It is a philosophical landmark. And The Cambridge Companion to Locke's "Essay Concerning Human Understanding" is a terrific collection of fifteen essays on this masterpiece.

Locke's Essay divides into four Books. Books I and II are about the origin of mental content and lay out Locke's empiricist account of concept acquisition and empiricist epistemology. After disputing nativism in Book I, Locke proceeds, in Book II, to the difficult task of providing an empiricist account of the origin of all our ideas. Book III develops a theory of language on the basis of his theory of ideas; and Book IV examines the scope of human knowledge and the grounds and degrees of belief and opinion. Each book develops philosophical themes whose ingenuity and originality establish Locke as one of the greatest philosophers of all times. The anti-nativist arguments of Book I not only threaten the doctrine of innate ideas commonly held in Locke's times by Descartes, the Cambridge Platonists, and members of the Anglican Church, but are still considered some of the most powerful arguments against current nativist accounts of the origin of concepts. His empiricist account of the origin of mental content set "the standard for subsequent accounts" (1) and some contemporary philosophers still invoke Locke's theory as a model for their own. The discussion of the metaphysics of primary and secondary qualities, his reflection on identity, the distinction between nominal and real essences, and his theory of language were not only grounded in seventeenth century debates, but are still the starting point of speculation for current theories about the metaphysics of color properties, personal identity and the problem of meaning and signification.

The Cambridge Companion to Locke's "Essay Concerning Human Understanding" follows the structure of Locke's Essay. It contains, in order of appearance, two essays on Book I, six on Book II, two on Book III and five on Book IV. The difference in the number of essays devoted to each book reflects the difference in length, rather than relevance, among the books in Locke's Essay. The only peculiar structural choice of the volume is making Thomas Lennon's essay "Locke on Ideas and Representation" chapter eight of the volume. Given the significance of Locke's theory of ideas and mental representation in the Essay, one might have expected Lennon's essay to appear first or at least first in the series of essays on Book II. But perhaps the editor thought that by chapter eight a reader will have already read various chapters on Locke's views on different types of ideas (ideas of sensation, ideas of power and substance) and thus be positioned to follow the discussion of ideas in general (though the argument could easily go the other way 'round).

The essays in this volume share two common features. First, most (with some variation in emphasis) start with an explanation of the topics at hand, offer a survey of the various exegetical and theoretical problems raised by these topics, present various solutions from the literature and propose their own conclusions on how to solve or dissolve these problems. This essay format promotes not only understanding but also critical reflection on key themes of the Essay and thereby renders the volume ideal for any student of Locke (undergraduate, graduate or scholar). Second, each contributor not only discusses central themes of the Essay in the context of the Scholastic background or seventeenth century debates, but also points out Locke's timeless contribution to various topics in contemporary philosophy.

Unfortunately, I will not be able to devote to each article the attention it deserves. I will present the content of some essays and comment more extensively on others. The volume opens with an essay by G.A.J. Rogers. In "The Intellectual Setting and Aims of the Essay," Rogers provides an informative account of the aim and scope of the Essay and of the intellectual development behind it. Of particular interest is the detailed analysis by which Rogers tracks Descartes' and Boyle's influences on Locke's philosophy.

The second essay, "Locke's Polemic against Nativism," is written by Samuel Rickless.  As Rickless notes, "a proper understanding of Locke's polemic serves to deepen one's understanding of the whole book" (66) since, for example, the anti-nativist arguments of Book I lead to the detailed discussion of the origin of every idea in Book II. Rickless begins by identifying the type of nativism (dispositional nativism) that Locke's polemic is directed against and its supporters. This part of the essay is useful inasmuch as it allows Rickless to dismiss the widespread view that Locke was addressing a straw man in his polemic (59). But the most impressive part of the essay consists in identifying and analyzing in detail the various arguments Locke provides against nativism. This is no easy task and Rickless does an exceptionally good job. He argues that although Locke is successful in criticizing the nativist "Argument from Universal Consent", Locke's own arguments against nativism are much less successful. I particularly agree with Rickless that Locke's appeal to memory in the argument that Rickless calls "The Argument from Lack of Universal Consent" "gives solace to the dispositional nativist" (61). Locke's account of memory (E.II.x.2) allows for the possibility that an idea can be in the mind without being brought to consciousness. But "if we say this, then why can't we say, in defense of dispositional nativism, that ideas that are never brought to consciousness but we have the ability to 'paint' on the canvas of our minds without any accompanying perceptions of having had them before [that is, innate ideas] are also in the mind?" (61) In cases like this, in my view, Locke blatantly begs the question against dispositional nativists like Descartes (at least in the case of some ideas). I also concur with Rickless that Locke's "argument from lack of innate ideas" (roughly the argument that there are no innate principles because their constitutive ideas are not innate) rests on the questionable premise that the ideas, for example, of identity and substance are unclear and hence not innate. But unlike Rickless I do not see the force of Locke's argument that it would be pointless for God to give us innate latent principles. "If Men can be ignorant or doubtful of what is innate, innate Principles are insisted on, and urged to no purpose" (E.iii.13), argues Locke. But why should these principles' not being known to us imply that they serve no purpose for us? In fact, in a famous passage where Descartes discusses the innateness of the idea of a triangle in an exchange with Gassendi, he argues that the latent presence of the idea of the triangle allows us to recognize triangular shapes in the physical world although we may never be aware of the true idea of the triangle.

Book II of Locke's Essay contains a taxonomy of ideas of central importance for the rest of the Essay and, in particular, for what Locke will argue about the reality of ideas in Book IV. Moreover, it is in this context that Locke lays the foundation of his empiricist epistemology and completes his attack on nativism by providing an empiricist story of the origin of all ideas. Martha Bolton's essay, "The Taxonomy of Ideas in Locke's Essay" (chapter three), is the first of six articles dedicated to Book II. Bolton presents Locke's classification of ideas and points out difficulties with which such a prima facie neat taxonomy is fraught. She offers textual evidence against the common reading -- certainly encouraged by Locke -- of simple ideas as atomic and of complex ideas as compositional ("Ideas that have compositional and noncompositional structure are found on both sides of the divide" (77)). She points out that Locke's taxonomy imposes constraints on his account of ideas and leaves no room for ideas we actually have (88, 100). Finally, Bolton shows, convincingly in my view, that a detailed analysis of Locke's account of simple ideas of sensation and of complex ideas of relation and substance reveals possible limitations of Locke's anti-nativism (73, 78, 89, 99).

In Book II, Locke draws the famous distinction between primary and secondary qualities. Michael Jacovides's essay, "Locke's Distinctions between Primary and Secondary Qualities" (chapter four), argues that Locke did not draw one distinction but many. One of the greatest merits of the essay is Jacovides's insightful analysis of the various arguments that Locke provides in favor of such distinctions.

The longest chapter of the Essay is chapter XXI of Book II, the chapter on power. Vere Chappell, in the essay "Power in Locke's Essay" (chapter five), explains what Locke meant by "power" in general and then devotes most of his attention to an examination of Locke's views on human will, freedom and motivation.

Locke's discussion of substance in chapter XXIII of Book II is one of the most fascinating discussions of Book II, but it also raises many interpretative issues. Edwin McCann, in "Locke on Substance" (chapter six), presents the traditional interpretation of substance as the logical notion of a substratum to qualities or the subject of predication. In light of the difficulties of reconciling this view of substance with Locke's corpuscularianism, alternative interpretations of Locke's account of substance have been offered in the literature. McCann, however, argues that the traditional interpretation fares better as an interpretation of Locke's views than any alternative reading. Particularly interesting is McCann's criticism of what is the most common alternative way of interpreting Locke's account, that is, the view according to which Locke identifies the substratum with the real essence of body. There are good grounds for this alternative reading. First, although, as McCann points out, Locke never explicitly identifies the substratum with real essence (186), there is strong circumstantial evidence for such identification. The reasoning sustaining the alternative view is that since, according to Locke, the sensible properties of a thing are observable to us but its substance is not, and similarly the real essence of a body is not observable to us but the sensible qualities flowing from it are, Locke identifies substance with the real essence or unknown constitution of things (185-186). Second, although it is true that the notion of a substratum is a logical one whereas the notion of real essence is a causal one, there is no inconsistency in one thing being related both logically and causally to the same qualities. Finally, this alternative interpretation "avoids saddling Locke with a commitment to substrata as real, distinct entities" (190). Despite the fact that McCann admits these points, he insists that especially Locke's correspondence with Stillingfleet provides evidence against this identification (187-189). 

Gideon Yaffe, in his essay "Locke on Identity and Diversity" (chapter seven), offers an original reading of Locke's theory of personal identity. Yaffe argues that the simple-memory (216) and appropriation (221) theories of personal identity are mistaken because they fail to appreciate the link Locke creates between the metaphysical question of personal identity and the moral question of punishment and reward. According to Yaffe, Locke's theory is a "susceptibility-to-punishment theory" (226), according to which "the assumed order of priority of the metaphysical and the moral [is reversed]: the metaphysical facts -- the facts about who is the same person as whom -- just are moral facts; they are facts about who is appropriately punished or rewarded for those past acts" (229). This is certainly a thought-provoking interpretation of Locke's views on personal identity. One worry is whether this theory is free of the problem of circularity that famously troubles other readings of Locke's theory (226). However, Yaffe has an interesting (but possibly counterintuitive) response to this worry (226-228). According to Yaffe, the "susceptibility-to-punishment theory" is not circular because "[who] is identical to whom depends on who is rightly rewarded or punished rather than the reverse" (226). Since it is the laws of nature ("God's laws linking crimes with punishments and good acts with rewards" (226)) that determine the identity between actor and sufferer, "whether or not a later and earlier act of consciousness are the same depends on the content of natural laws" (227) and, so, the circularity is broken.

Thomas Lennon, in "Locke on Ideas and Representation" (chapter eight), discusses one of the key concepts of Locke's Essay. What are ideas, for Locke? How do they represent things to us? Do they represent things to us as proxies between the mind and extra-mental reality, hence lifting the so-called veil of ideas? Or are ideas simply modes of presenting these objects to the mind? Lennon argues for the latter reading of Locke's account of ideas throughout the article and addresses other interesting questions such as, what is it that makes an idea represent one object rather than another for Locke?

In Book III, Locke presents his theory of language and draws the famous distinction between nominal and real essences. In "Locke on Essences and Classification" (chapter nine), Margaret Atherton discusses Locke's distinction between nominal and real essences. Locke's critical target is the Scholastic view that our classification of things into kinds is grounded in reality. According to Locke, instead, this classification depends on nominal essences or abstract ideas and, hence, it is the "Workmanship of the Understanding." Although the general picture is clear enough, there are pressing questions raised by the distinction. Atherton addresses these questions while developing her own interpretation. Of particular interest is Atherton's persuasive defense of the interpretation according to which Locke's distinction between nominal and real essence is "mandated by his new theory of ideas" (267) rather than being motivated by his ontological commitment to corpuscularianism (268-278).

In chapter ten, "Language, Meaning, and Mind in Locke's Essay," Michael Losonsky defends the view that Locke's theory of language presents a theory of meaning along the lines of Frege's distinction between sense and reference against recent commentators who have challenged this view and argued that the relation between words and ideas, according to Locke, is not a semantic relation.

In Book IV, Locke defines knowledge in general as "the perception of the connexion and agreement, or disagreement and repugnancy of any of our ideas" (E IV.i.2). This definition raises many questions. For example, how is this definition compatible with sensitive knowledge, given that sensitive knowledge is about external things? In chapter eleven, "Locke on Knowledge," Lex Newman argues that there is no tension between the definition of knowledge and sensitive knowledge (324-325; 331-333; and 349-350) or between such a definition and other claims Locke makes in Book IV. Of particular interest is Newman's argument (against the common view) that all knowable truths are analytic for Locke. In Book IV, tension emerges between Locke's "epistemic modesty" (352) and his ontological commitments about the ultimate nature of body and the mind. Notoriously, Locke admitted the possibility of thinking matter (E.IV.iii), but in the course of his argument for the existence of God (E.IV.x), "Locke seems to argue that no materialist account of thought […] is possible" (353).

Lisa Downing, in "Locke's Ontology" (chapter twelve), argues that the tensions between Locke's dogmatism and skepticism can be dissolved.

In chapter thirteen, "The Moral Epistemology of Locke's Essay," Catherine Wilson argues that "Locke is the first philosopher to treat morality as a set of anthropological and psychological phenomena" (404) while addressing the difficult question of the tension between Locke's realism and relativism about moral principles and ideas. In Book IV, Locke distinguishes between knowledge and belief. Knowledge is defined as the perception of the agreement among our ideas whereas belief is defined as the presumption of such an agreement.

David Owen, in "Locke on Judgment" (chapter fourteen), examines Locke's account of judgment and belief. After arguing that unlike Descartes, Locke held a "single-act theory of judgment" (according to which understanding a proposition and affirming or denying it are the same thing (409-418)), Owen examines Locke's account of the grounds of belief formation.

The volume closes with an essay by Nicholas Jolley, "Locke on Faith and Reason". Jolley discusses the arguments (based mainly on the principles of Locke's epistemology) by which Locke "clips the wings of revelation" (441) and argues against the accusation that Locke's defense of reason in the context of his discussion of faith is either inconsistent or circular.

Locke's Essay Concerning Human Understanding is a rich and challenging text. The apparent neatness of the taxonomy of ideas can actually generate confusion for the reader; his empiricist account of the origin of ideas reveals wrinkles here and there that make one wonder about the limits and scope of Locke' empiricism; his discussion of the metaphysics of primary and secondary qualities can be puzzling. (What are Locke's arguments, if any, for the reality of primary qualities? What is the ontological status of secondary qualities for Locke exactly?) One could go on. This collection renders the intellectual journey through the Essay much smoother. There are numerous articles written on any aspect of Locke's philosophy but the very nature of this new volume and the way in which it has been thought out and edited by Lex Newman makes it an ideal accompanying tool in the study of Locke's Essay. After finishing reading this collection, a reader will not only have acquired information about the main topics of the Essay and the philosophical context that led to Locke's discussions of them, but will be knowledgeable about the current status of the secondary literature on these topics and will have a better sense of Locke's timeless contribution to philosophy. The Cambridge Companion to Locke's "Essay Concerning Human Understanding" perfectly accomplishes the aim it was designed to accomplish. It is a perfect (if not in size certainly in content) vade mecum to Locke's Essay. Present and future generations of students and scholars will benefit from the appearance of this volume.