The Cambridge Companion to Logical Empiricism

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Alan Richardson and Thomas Uebel (eds.), The Cambridge Companion to Logical Empiricism, Cambridge University Press, 2007, 430pp., $34.99 (pbk.), ISBN 9780521796286.

Reviewed by Greg Frost-Arnold, University of Nevada, Las Vegas


For much of the second half of the 20th Century, the primary role logical empiricism played was that of the argumentative foil. The 'received view' on a given topic (especially in philosophy of science, logic, or language) was frequently identified with some supposedly dogmatic tenet of logical empiricism. However, during the last twenty-five years, scholars have paid serious, sustained attention to what the logical positivists, individually and collectively, actually said. Early scholarship on logical empiricism had to engage in heavy-duty PR work: why should anyone study the now-discarded mixture of blunders and implausibilities collected under the label 'logical empiricism'? However, thanks to the efforts of the pioneers, people studying the logical empiricists today need not articulate an extended apologia for their chosen subject of study -- rather, they can simply get on with their work. Many of the best fruits of these recent labors are on display in The Cambridge Companion to Logical Empiricism (CCLE), edited by Alan Richardson and Thomas Uebel. The quality of the fourteen chapters ranges from high to quite high. The only substantive unevenness between chapters is in purpose and scope: certain chapters are introductory survey articles, while others read like journal articles -- though most contributions lie somewhere between these two extremes. In this review, I first discuss certain leitmotivs running through the Companion, and then briefly discuss each chapter.

Much recent scholarship on logical empiricism attempts to dismantle the stereotypical view of logical empiricism current in 20th Century philosophy -- on several fronts. First, a fair amount of effort has been devoted to showing that the views of the logical empiricists (meaning either the Vienna Circle, or their intellectual allies) are highly heterogeneous. As several contributors argue, the common ground shared by all logical empiricists does not stretch much beyond interest in and respect for the sciences, and a commitment to one or another form of empiricism. Neurath has enjoyed a resurgence of attention in part because he was a central member of the Vienna Circle although his views diverged radically from the stereotypical image of logical empiricism. Mormann's chapter shows the different conceptions of theory current among logical empiricists, and Uebel, Hardcastle, and Nemeth's contributions (among others) show that logical empiricists were not concerned with math and physics alone.

Another bustling area of work on logical empiricism involves arguments that the views actually promulgated by logical empiricists in their sophisticated publications bear little resemblance to the views commonly attributed to them. This is a favorite theme in the field, and it is sounded throughout this Companion. For example, the logical empiricists are, in an important sense, naturalists (cf. Richardson 2003). Relatedly, many took great interest in specific scientific theories: e.g. Reichenbach, as Hoffmann points out, was one of the students in Einstein's first seminar on General Relativity. Although logical empiricists are accused of operating at the overly abstract level of 'theory T'' and 'observation O,' CCLE demonstrates their interest in specific sciences, with five chapters dedicated to logical empiricism's relations to particular sciences. Creath and Richardson ask (and begin to answer) the further question: how did such misrepresentations of logical empiricism take hold in philosophical circles?

Another feature of much recent work on logical empiricism on display in this Companion is that comparatively less attention is paid to detailed argument reconstruction and assessment, and comparatively more to uncovering the causes -- both 'internal' and 'external'/socio-historical -- of the logical empiricists' beliefs. This follows the wider trend in history of philosophy more generally, but logical empiricist scholarship, unlike other subfields such as ancient and early modern philosophy, lacks the argument reconstructions and evaluations of earlier generations of scholars. Of course, there are very able philosophers, like Scott Soames, who have engaged in detailed argument reconstruction and assessment of logical empiricists' views (Soames 2003). However, readers hoping for work like Soames' in this Companion will likely be disappointed.

This historical approach is most evident in the first three chapters, which cover the groups and institutions that constitute logical empiricism's context. Friedrich Stadler presents a wealth of historical detail about the Vienna Circle's incarnations and their vicissitudes, as well as its members' relations to wider intellectual and socio-political movements. Despite current complaints about the abstract nature of the logical empiricists' work, Stadler (and others) make clear that they were interested in changing their wider world. Dieter Hoffmann's chapter on the 'Berlin Circle' provides a useful corrective to the usual emphasis on the Viennese thinkers, by tracing the development of this group from its foundation by Joseph Petzoldt through Reichenbach's flight from the Nazis. Here, again, emphasis is laid upon the broader context of this group, including its interactions with the Vienna Circle, such as jointly editing Erkenntnis. As Hoffmann explains, the Berlin Circle sympathized with their Vienna colleagues, but thought of themselves as fully distinct, especially because of their desire to engage in detail with current scientific findings -- a difference evident between e.g. Carnap's Aufbau or Logical Syntax on the one hand, and Reichenbach's Theory of Relativity and A Priori Knowledge on the other.

Chapters 1 and 2 each close with the rise of National Socialism, which ushered in the demise of both the Vienna and Berlin Circles. This leads naturally to Chapter 3, where George Reisch discusses what happened to the proponents of scientific philosophy after the Nazis drove them from Europe. Reisch's chapter, which distills some of his recent book (Reisch 2005), answers the question: How and why did logical empiricist philosophy, after arriving in the US, lose its connection to socio-political issues and questions of value (articulated clearly in the logical empiricists’ 1929 Manifesto)? Reisch's answer: Neurath's Unity of Science movement, which "was the public, pedagogic, and scientific life of logical empiricism" (59), died because it was considered "broadly sympathetic to socialism at a time when America … [was] being scrubbed clean of red or pink elements" (60). The Unity of Science advocated rational planning of human activities, using a broadly scientific method; their notion of planning, however, sounded uncomfortably similar for some to fascist and socialist sentiments. Reisch's work draws on some surprising sources, e.g. the FBI files of Philipp Frank and Carnap.

The second part of the book covers general issues. In Chapter 4, Michael Friedman clearly distills his work on the evolution of the concept of the a priori, developed at greater length in his Reconsidering Logical Positivism (1999) and Dynamics of Reason (2001). Here, Friedman traces the concept from Schlick, to Reichenbach, via the influence of Poincaré, through Carnap's dissertation Der Raum and into the Aufbau, finally arriving at Carnap's conviction that epistemology should be replaced by the logic of science in Logical Syntax. But Friedman also presents a new suggestion, which is not of merely historical interest. He isolates a previously unnoticed difference between Carnap and Quine, viz. their respective conceptions of experience: for Quine, it is similar to the raw sensations of Hume, whereas Carnap uses a much richer, more Kantian conception. Friedman concludes that "Quine's vision of empiricism is in no way compulsory" (114), since it relies upon a contestable notion of experience. Friedman thereby bolsters his case against Quinean holism, which he presented in his Dynamics of Reason.

Maria Carla Galavotti offers a clear overview of logical empiricist debates and positions on confirmation and probability in Chapter 5. This chapter covers some well-known ground, and will be especially useful for people who are not very familiar with the material. The chapter is pitched at a relatively introductory level, which will be useful for students unfamiliar with the various interpretations of probability. Galavotti also includes some interesting, less widely known material of interest to scholars, such as whether later Carnap can be considered a subjectivist in any interesting sense (Galavotti's answer: no).

Thomas Mormann covers the logical empiricist accounts of scientific theory. Though Carnap's notion of theory is often taken to be the logical empiricist conception, Mormann admirably illustrates the diversity of opinions. Neurath receives the most detail, but Hempel, Nagel, Frank, and Feigl are all covered. Mormann concludes from this diversity that there is no such thing as the logical empiricist picture of theories. He also covers usual objections and replies to the orthodox view(s), especially the Ramsey sentence account, which makes this chapter helpful for newcomers and students.

Each of the chapters in Part III deals with logical empiricist interactions with a particular discipline: math, physics, psychology, the social sciences, and the history and sociology of science. Steven Awodey and André Carus cover philosophy of mathematics. Their article focuses primarily on how Carnap arrived at the philosophy of mathematics in Logical Syntax by grappling with central claims of Wittgenstein's Tractatus. For example, Carnap accepts the Tractarian position that the laws of logic are simply a by-product of language, but rejects the strongly representational account of meaning found in Wittgenstein's picture theory. Awodey and Carus draw on several unpublished Carnapian documents to support their developmental account well. Although they nicely frame their chapter with more general claims about philosophy of mathematics in logical empiricism, the neophyte will not finish this article with an overall picture of the state of the art of work on logical empiricist philosophy of mathematics -- one of the few areas in logical empiricism studies where there is a reasonably well-developed secondary literature.

Thomas Ryckman's chapter on philosophy of physics focuses primarily on Reichenbach's work on relativity, quantum mechanics, time and causality. The exposition is relatively dense, but can usually be followed with some patience; explaining both conceptually perplexing revolutionary physics and the logical empiricists' understanding of it in twenty pages is extremely difficult, but Ryckman does an admirable job. My only reservation is that Ryckman sometimes asserts that a particular logical empiricist claim is incorrect or misunderstands the physics, without fully justifying that assertion (e.g. Reichenbach's idea that "the generically curved space-times of general relativity can be considered as pieced together from little bits of Minkowski space-times" (204)) -- but this is surely attributable to Ryckman's space constraints.

Gary Hardcastle addresses the relationships between logical empiricists and psychology, an area that has not seen as much scholarly research as other subfields. Hardcastle sounds one of the common notes mentioned in my introductory remarks: people working in the logical empiricist tradition did pay attention to current psychological developments. He provides diverse evidence for this claim: 10% of the first 100 articles in Philosophy of Science were about psychology, Carnap uses Gestalt psychology to inform his concept of experience in the Aufbau, and the behaviorists found supporters among the logical empiricists -- and vice versa. For example, the behaviorist E. C. Tolman spent time in Vienna and dealt with the question Hardcastle takes as the focus of his essay: if science is intersubjective, then how can there be a science of conscious experience, which is traditionally considered private?

Thomas Uebel covers logical empiricist involvement with social science before World War II. As Uebel acknowledges, among the central logical empiricists, only Neurath cultivated a serious research program in this area, but certain 'peripheral' figures contributed as well, such as Karl Menger, Felix Kauffmann, and Edgar Zilsel. Uebel outlines the difference between two types of unity of science thesis: unity of language and unity of laws. Uebel stresses that Neurath strongly endorsed linguistic unity in science (like other logical empiricists), but was more skeptical than most of the reduction of all laws to physical ones. Finally, Uebel defends Neurath from certain contemporaneous criticisms. This chapter also provides an excellent account of the protocol sentence debate, which is very fortunate, because many of the other chapters refer to the debate only in passing.

Elisabeth Nemeth canvasses the relations between logical empiricism and two subdisciplines often considered anathema to it: history and sociology of science. As Nemeth amply illustrates, Neurath, Zilsel, and Frank were all interested with questions in the history and sociology of science. For example, Neurath pushed the line, recently pursued by Longino and others, that in the face of the underdetermination of theory by evidence, social factors can be and are used to select among empirically equivalent rivals. Neurath also wrote histories of political economy and optics. Finally, Nemeth describes ways in which certain Kuhnian ideas (e.g. 'Kuhn loss') had clear precursors in Philipp Frank's work.

The final part of the book covers three of the logical empiricists' most influential critical interlocutors: Wittgenstein, Quine, and Kuhn. David Stern discusses Wittgenstein's 1932 charge that Carnap's article "The Physical Language as the Universal Language of Science" (English trans. The Unity of Science) plagiarizes Wittgenstein's ideas. Specifically, Wittgenstein argued that the idea of physicalism is present already in the Tractatus, as is the distinction between material and formal modes of speech. Stern helpfully points out the similarities between the two men's positions, thereby showing how Wittgenstein may have come to the conclusion of plagiarism. However, Stern argues that there is a wide conceptual gulf between Carnap and Wittgenstein, since Carnap completely rejects the central Tractarian position that logical form can only be shown, and not said. Furthermore, Stern finds historical evidence (from unpublished interactions between Carnap, Neurath, and Neider) that, regardless of how conceptually close Wittgenstein and Carnap were, Carnap simply did not draw his conception of physicalism, in any direct sense, from the Tractatus -- Neurath's influence on Carnap was far more significant.

Richard Creath argues that Quine's views -- early, middle, and late -- are typical of general logical empiricist commitments. For example, Quine's criticism of the concept of analyticity is analogous to Carnap's criticism of certain Heideggerian pseudo-concepts, since both are based on empiricist theories of meaning. Creath also stresses that the later Quine returns to views that are closer to Carnap's; for example, Quine provides a criterion for synonymy (interchangeability salva confirmatione) and he moves closer to a Carnapian 'two-tiered' epistemology in his later works. Creath does not claim that Quine "derived" his characteristic views from the Vienna Circle, but rather that he 'reinvented' them (336).

In the final chapter, Alan Richardson considers the supposedly devastating effect Kuhn's Structure of Scientific Revolutions had on logical empiricism. The orthodoxy began to be questioned in Reisch’s 1991 article: for starters, Structure was published in the logical empiricists' Encyclopedia of Unified Science. Furthermore, in his editorial correspondence, Carnap suggests that Kuhn's account of scientific change fits well with his own account -- Carnapian linguistic frameworks bear many similarities to Kuhnian paradigms. Additionally, Richardson notes, no logical empiricists published highly critical reviews of Structure, unlike Popper and his allies. Richardson also shows that the target of Structure bears little resemblance to any stance seriously advocated by any logical empiricist. He then asks the natural question: how did this mismatch arise between Kuhn's conception of logical empiricism and the real thing? Kuhn acknowledged in the 1990s that he was not intimately familiar with the most sophisticated accounts of logical empiricists' doctrines. Rather, Richardson suggests, since the logical empiricists and their allies wrote quasi-popular accounts of their views, Kuhn -- and the wider intellectual world -- likely took these oversimplified versions as their complete, final view. That is, the logical empiricists fashioned straw man self-portraits, thereby providing easy targets.

This Companion is, as a whole, an excellent introduction to the growing field of scholarship on logical empiricism. The field is not yet as sprawling and expansive as (e.g.) Aristotle or Hume scholarship, and the Companion will bring a reader new to the field up to speed with large swaths of the state of the art. Perhaps the most salutary effect of this volume is that it provides a new 'received view' of logical empiricism: further research will expand upon and correct the historically-informed views found in CCLE, instead of the massively distorted image of logical empiricism that dominated the scene twenty-five years ago.

Works Cited

Friedman, Michael (1999). Reconsidering Logical Positivism. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Friedman, Michael (2001). Dynamics of Reason. Stanford, CA: CSLI.

Reisch, George (1991). "Did Kuhn Kill Logical Empiricism?" Philosophy of Science 58, 264-277.

Reisch, George (2005). How the Cold War Transformed Philosophy of Science: To the Icy Slopes of Logic. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Richardson, Alan (2003). "Logical Empiricism, American Pragmatism, and the Fate of Scientific Philosophy in North America," in Logical Empiricism in North America, Hardcastle and Richardson (eds.), Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1-24.

Soames, Scott (2003). Philosophical Analysis in the Twentieth Century, 2 vols. Princeton: Princeton University Press.