The Cambridge Companion to Medieval Ethics

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Thomas Williams (ed.), The Cambridge Companion to Medieval Ethics, Cambridge University Press, 2019, 410pp., $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 9781316618110.

Reviewed by Colleen McCluskey, Saint Louis University


For many years, outside of Catholic circles, philosophers regarded work produced in the so-called European Middle Ages as philosophically uninteresting or irrelevant. Much like the medieval period itself, which for centuries was characterized as the Dark Ages, writers working in the years roughly 500-1500 CE were thought to have produced texts that either did not satisfy rigorous philosophical standards or simply reproduced the religious dogma of the era. In either case, such work was regarded as having little to no bearing on current philosophical thought. These attitudes began to change in the second half of the twentieth century, especially due to the work of Norman Kretzmann and the emerging prominence of particular Catholic institutions. Nevertheless, this early work on medieval thought represented the philosophical interests of the researchers in question, in particular, metaphysics, logic, and philosophy of religion. Although this is not of itself objectionable, still, it presented a misleading picture of medieval interests as heavily invested in those topics. Few scholars recognized that medieval thinkers produced theories in ethics.

This neglect of medieval ethics has begun to change. Several books on topics within ethics have been published in recent years by major presses, including ones on the reception of Aristotle's ethics in medieval philosophy, moral dilemmas, moral psychology, ethical theory, and a number on the treatment of ethics by individual thinkers, especially Thomas Aquinas. The recent Cambridge History of Medieval Philosophy (2014) includes sections on philosophical psychology, which forms the basis for medieval ethics, as well as sections on ethics and political philosophy, as does The Oxford Handbook of Medieval Philosophy (2015). Other general anthologies of medieval philosophy have begun to include chapters on medieval ethics.

The Cambridge Companion to Medieval Ethics, edited by Thomas Williams, is a welcome addition to this trend. Williams is a prominent researcher, especially well-known for his work on Anselm of Canterbury and John Duns Scotus, and his translations of various medieval treatises particularly on free will, philosophy of religion, and ethics. The contributors to the volume are predominately recognized experts: senior scholars and endowed chairs. Christian thought is often assumed to have been the norm in Europe during the Middle Ages, but Williams has included renown scholars working on Jewish and Islamic thought. This reflects the growing acknowledgement that Jewish and Muslim thinkers were both an important part of the landscape in medieval Europe (particularly in Spain, which was religiously pluralist in the Middle Ages) and significantly influenced their Christian counterparts. Furthermore, scholars are now recognizing that prominent Christian thinkers also influenced their non-Christian counterparts; for example, T. M. Rudavsky discusses Aquinas's influence on Joseph Albo's account of natural law (109-110).

Medieval ethics might seem both familiar and foreign to contemporary ethicists. Erik Kenyon points out that medieval thinkers tended to focus on the goodness or badness of lives while our contemporary theorists discuss ethics in terms of the rightness and wrongness of action (11). In keeping with a religious framework, medieval authors included elements not generally covered in work on ethics, such as the notions of sin and grace (addressed by Eileen C. Sweeney, Chapter 16). Nevertheless, there are many points of intersection. The recovery of virtue ethics also beginning in the mid-twentieth century is one area of convergence. Medieval accounts of happiness and well-being are another.

Part I provides a general overview of the history of ethical thought in the Middle Ages. The first three chapters cover early, middle, and late periods of medieval Christian views. The advantage of dividing the discussion among three chapters is that each author can (and does) examine both better-known and lesser-known scholars. For example, Kenyon discusses not only Augustine and Boethius but also Alcuin, who took part in Charlemagne's educational and intellectual revival in the eighth century, and John Scottus Eriugena, who in the ninth century introduced Pseudo-Dionysius's system of negative theology, which was highly influential on later figures. Ian Wilks covers the period from Anselm to Albertus Magnus, focusing not only on well-known scholars, such as Peter Abelard, but also figures contemporary to them, such as William of Champeaux and the School of Laon. Although the debate over universals between Abelard and William is likely to be familiar to researchers of medieval philosophy, their ethical views are less likely to be so. Wilks also surveys the generation just prior to Aquinas, including Peter Lombard, William of Auxerre, Philip the Chancellor, and Aquinas's own teacher, Albert, who was one of the premier scholars of his time.

Aquinas is probably the most well-known medieval thinker today, and in Chapter 3, Eric W. Hagedorn faithfully (and of course briefly) surveys his ethical system. Hagedorn frames his discussion of Aquinas's theory in terms of two main components: his discussion of natural law by which on Hagedorn's interpretation, human beings come to understand their moral obligations; and his discussion of virtue, the possession of which enables human beings to meet those obligations (57-60). Hagedorn's discussion of the effects of the condemnation of 1277 on subsequent work in ethics greatly enriches this chapter (60-61).

Chapters 4 and 5 contain overviews of Islamic and Jewish thought respectively. Jon McGinnis argues that Islamic work on ethics was approached from either philosophical or theological perspectives with points of intersections between them (77-78). The two approaches diverge in their basic moral theory: Islamic philosophers were for the most part virtue theorists while Islamic theologians were deontologists (91). Although the details of their writings demonstrate important differences from the Christian tradition, Islamic scholars also examined many of the same topics, including moral psychology, theories of happiness, natural law, and virtue ethics. This is not entirely surprising since their work is influenced by some of the same sources, namely Plato (although they had access to Platonic texts that medieval Christian writers lacked), Aristotle, and the Stoics (83).

Rudavsky identifies two general strands of medieval Jewish thought. Some Jewish scholars considered the relationship between divine law (halakha) and morality: the question being whether there is a moral code independently of divine commands (101, 109-115). Aristotle's Nicomachean Ethics profoundly affected the approach of other Jewish thinkers. Theorists developed accounts of eudaimonia broadly within the Aristotelian tradition. The doctrine of the mean was a prominent feature of many of these accounts (102-109). That is not to say that they simply reproduced Aristotle's account. Jewish theological perspectives also influenced the character of their accounts of virtue and duties (see Rudavsky's discussion of Ibn Gabirol, Bahya ibn Paquda, and Mainmonides).

Part II examines specific topics within medieval work in ethics, including various aspects of moral psychology (e.g., intellect and will, practical reasoning, emotions, freedom of action), happiness, virtue, law, sin, and grace. Further chapters address topics not always associated with ethics, such as mysticism in the Christian and Islamic traditions, ethics in medieval economic theory, and the relationship between the self and the common good. Although all very interesting and of high quality, the chapters on general moral psychology cover territory that has become prominent in the literature in recent years. In the space remaining, I will focus on the chapters addressing the less familiar topics.

As Amber Griffioen and Mohammad Sadegh Zahedi point out, mystical texts are not often considered to be sources of ethical theory. They argue that labeling texts as the work of mystics can serve to marginalize their authors and exclude them from the philosophical canon (281). In fact, the authors of texts often characterized as mystical in nature did not describe their texts in these terms (281). Drawing on Christina Van Dyke's definition in "Mysticism," in Cambridge History of Medieval Philosophy, vol. 2 (Robert Pasnau and Christina Van Dyke, eds., 2010), they describe the mystical tradition as embodying

a series of teachings and practices embedded within a particular religious context that are aimed at both understanding and achieving the appropriate relationship of the human to the divine in this life, where this relationship is assumed to go "beyond the realm of normal earthly experience" and to represent "the ultimate fulfillment of human nature". (282, quotation from Van Dyke, 722)

Both mystical and non-mystical writers argue that the ultimate end of human life is a relationship or union with the divine, which constitutes the fulfillment of human nature. They differ on the details of how to proceed toward that end. As Griffioen and Zahedi point out, the starting point for many writers working in the mystical tradition is the radical otherness and transcendence of the divine (285). As such, it is impossible for human beings to comprehend or describe such a being. This raises a question about the coherence of the mystical project: how to identify a path to a being about which nothing can be understood (286). This worry is not restricted simply to the mystics. Many medieval thinkers who developed what we now recognize as systematic ethical theories also discussed what human beings could come to know or how we could come to talk about God. Aquinas, who famously adopted an analogical method to predicate properties of God, nevertheless retained an acknowledgement of the via negativa. Even Scotus, who argued for univocal predication, was willing to accept some aspects of divine ineffability. Just as with these thinkers, those in the mystical tradition find ways to adopt human language to express ideas about God that enable adherents to pursue the human telos (286-288).

Griffioen and Zahedi go on to discuss how one could visualize an account of right action from mystical writings, drawing upon both the Christian and the Islamic traditions (289-302). Mystics adopt the framework of virtues and vices, but the virtues that one is encouraged to achieve are not the standard Aristotelian ones. Rather, they are characterized by Griffioen and Zahedi as negative virtues and include a profound humility, detachment from the world in order to facilitate complete receptivity to the divine, and releasement, ultimately a form of letting go of the self (293-294). These virtues enable one to overcome corporeal resistance and arrive at a condition of passivity and acceptance of the divine will. The ultimate goal of developing mystical virtues is to arrive at absolute fulfillment and self-realization. Mystics achieve this through the universal experience of suffering. This teaches them how to bear suffering, and for Christian mystics, ultimately understanding how to suffer with Jesus, which is the final stage of transformation (297).

Islamic mystics also draw upon the reality of suffering. However, for at least some of them, suffering leads the mystic to the realization of a vast separation between human beings and the divine (297). Unlike the suffering that results from unsuitable attachments to the material realm, this suffering arises from the awareness of the truth about one's condition. But insofar as it is an authentic suffering, it is also transformative (298).

These descriptions might suggest an ethic of passivity that cannot be action-guiding (293). Nevertheless, Griffioen and Zahedi resist this conclusion. They argue for agency throughout the account. First, developing the requisite virtues of humility, detachment, and releasement requires practice, just as it does for a traditional Aristotelian account of the virtues (298). Secondly, moving through suffering towards transformation requires a response on the part of the mystic (298). Finally, activity and choice continue to play roles in the life of the mystic even after one achieves the final goal of submission to the divine will (300). Griffioen and Zahedi discuss Meister Eckhart's startling interpretation of the Martha and Mary story from the Christian Scriptures. Far from favoring Mary's position, who sits in submission at the feet of Jesus listening to his words, Eckhart argues that in her preoccupation with the tasks of hospitality, Martha is the more virtuous. On Eckhart's view, Martha has achieved transcendence and has returned to the world better able to comprehend the value and nature of all the virtues. Thus, she is better able to live in the world while also enjoying a profound union with God. Mary, on the other hand, runs the risk of remaining tethered to the pleasure of Jesus's company, failing to progress toward transcendence (300-301). The structure of the mystical life is not incompatible with an engagement in the world.

What I find interesting in their discussion are the many points of connection between a mystical account of ethics and the more standard medieval accounts, at least in the Christian tradition, which is the only medieval tradition on which I feel qualified to comment. Both approaches argue for an ultimate end for human life consisting of a relationship with God. Both include a detailed account of the virtues and the vices as well as a central role for the virtues in progress toward that end. Both argue that God's grace is required in order to complete the journey, since union with God is beyond the capacity of human nature to achieve on one's own. And as Griffioen and Zahedi point out, both approaches define the ultimate end as a way of life (301). Although the content of each differs rather radically, there remains a fundamental ethical framework in common between them.

I found the chapter on Christian and Islamic mysticism a welcome addition to the volume. On my view, it greatly expands our understanding of the character of medieval ethics and helps to illuminate an approach that has been relegated to the margins or excluded from philosophical consideration. A chapter on the medieval Jewish mystical tradition would have been welcome as well.

In Chapter 14, Roberto Lambertini considers how medieval authors evaluated the ethics of economic practices. The medieval discussion is framed broadly in terms of generosity and just acquisition of goods, especially in the early Middle Ages (313). The medieval period is famous for arguing that lending money with interest was sinful. Nevertheless, as Lambertini demonstrates, these writers discuss topics other than usury, although usury has its place in medieval concerns. Ambrose, for example, argues that usury is but one of the various ways in which the rich exploit the poor (308). Ambrose traces the root of financial evil to the evolution of private property, which sets up conditions under which the poor may be oppressed. Charity for the impoverished becomes a form of restitution (308). Ambrose also helps to establish an economic moral vocabulary by incorporating into his theory virtues such as beneficence and generosity and vices such as avarice. This vocabulary is retained late into the thirteenth century, for example, in Scotus's characterization of property transfers as forms of generosity (319).

Beginning in the twelfth century, with the rise of a moneyed economy and the increasing prominence of the merchant class, the focus turns toward licit and illicit ways to acquire wealth (309). Accounts of avarice become more developed. Avarice has two aspects. First, it involves retaining wealth for oneself far beyond what is required for sustenance. Secondly, avarice encourages an insatiable desire to acquire still more wealth, failing to be satisfied with what one already possesses. Various virtues keep these tendencies in check: liberality and justice, for example (310). According to Lambertini, the complete recovery of Nicomachean Ethics in the thirteenth century importantly changes the understanding and theorizing of these virtues (310-312). Another focus of these texts is on the regulation of the use of money in exchange for other goods. The Aristotelian understanding of justice plays a role here, governing both just and unjust exchanges (213-214).

Lambertini provides important nuance and context for the discussion of economic ideas in the medieval period. For example, in his discussion of usury, he notes that the topic arises in a wide variety of different texts, including the penitential handbook, which was used as an aid in the confessional (313). This context helps to specify what economic practices count as usury and how such cases are to be addressed. Although usury is often taken in a strict sense as the lending of money with interest, originally it was viewed more broadly as a set of practices by which the wealthy benefit from what Lambertini calls "the economic weakness of others" (314). Furthermore, toward the end of the medieval period, citizens of Florence and other northern and central Italian cities were expected to loan money to the civil authorities, which money was repaid with interest (321). Thus, not all forms of interest were denounced in the medieval period, although the practice in Florence was controversial. The idea of restitution is also an important part of this discussion; as a sin that involves the exploitation of others, repentance of usury requires that the illicitly obtained goods be returned, to the poor if a specific victim cannot be identified (316).

As the merchant class gained prominence in Europe, social attitudes shifted from the assumption that merchants are greedy individuals prone to avarice to a regard for them as members of the community providing goods essential to its wellbeing (316-317). Lambertini argues that this idea underlies Peter John Olivi's ideas on usury. Olivi argued that in loaning money, the lender is entitled to charge more than the capital because had he invested that money instead, he would have realized a profit. Olivi regards this profit as a justified entitlement and a benefit to the entire community, so long as the merchant's motive is the common good. It follows from this that his actions do not constitute usury (318-319).

In his brief discussion of vices associated with unjustified uses of money, Lambertini characterizes them as vices in opposition to individual virtues. This is surely adequate for many of the vices, but I think it worth mentioning that in the medieval tradition going all the way back to the desert fathers in Egypt and the beginning of European monasticism, avarice for example was regarded as a capital vice. Sweeney has a discussion of the capital vices in general and avarice in particular (355-366). Capital vices are dangerous because not only do they harm the possessor of the vice, but they also incline such individuals toward the acquisition of additional associated vices. Furthermore, avarice was one of two vices considered to be the root from which all evil arises (the other is pride). As a root cause of sin, avarice involves the insatiable desire for more, as does pride on Sweeney's view (362). Such a root vice would be a super-capital vice, so to speak, because it leads to other capital vices.

The capital vices originated as an explanation for the struggles experienced by the desert fathers in Egypt; they were originally thought to be demons sent to tempt the monk to give up his commitment to the desert life. Sweeney argues that they rest on the assumption that the moral life is a struggle against evil. On this view, the goal in life is not moderation, as in Aristotelian ethics, but asceticism (358). Both Sweeney (358, 362) and Lambertini (310) note that this older tradition challenges the Aristotelian framework that gains prominence in the thirteenth century. The Aristotelian account of virtues as the mean between two extremes appears not to fit well with the concept of vices that give rise to other vices. Nevertheless, medieval authors seem not to regard these two traditions as incompatible. For example, in both De malo and Summa theologiae, Aquinas treats the capital vices both as vices opposed to virtues and as capital vices. For Aquinas, the capital vices move individuals to pursue genuine goods albeit in a disordered manner. The understanding of avarice as an inordinate desire for money retains its earlier character (mentioned by Lambertini); it manifests itself either in terms of hoarding the money one possesses or in terms of its acquisition, that is, either in quantity (acquiring too much) or in manner (acquiring money deceitfully). This in turn can give rise to further vices, such as fraud, treachery, robbery, hardheartedness, and restlessness. Avarice in either manifestation can be regarded as a vice of excess in opposition to the virtuous mean. Thus, it is not obvious to me that the fundamental character of this vice cannot be accommodated by both traditions.

The Cambridge Companion series provides a useful overview of the ideas of important thinkers or movements within philosophy. The volume edited by Williams on medieval ethics is a worthy addition to the series. It should be of value both to established scholars and those seeking a broad introduction to the topic.