The Cambridge Companion to Merleau-Ponty

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Taylor Carman and Mark Hansen, eds., The Cambridge Companion to Merleau-Ponty, Cambridge University Press, 2005, 406pp, $27.99 (pbk), ISBN: 0521007771.

Reviewed by Jack Reynolds, University of Tasmania


The authors and themes chosen for any particular edition of the Cambridge Companion series are always likely to constitute a point of contestation, and this latest volume dedicated to Maurice Merleau-Ponty is no exception. While the essays are generally first-rate, and although two of the most important French-speaking Merleau-Ponty scholars have contributed excellent essays to this collection (Merleau-Ponty's one-time student and some-time interlocutor, Claude Lefort, and Renaud Barbaras, Professor of philosophy at the Sorbonne), many of the major scholars involved in the reinvigoration of Merleau-Ponty's thought in the US and around the English-speaking world are absent. Much of the renewed attention accorded to Merleau-Ponty's work has revolved around debates concerning his proximity to, and distance from, post-structuralism, but philosophers preoccupied with such themes were not, it seems, asked to contribute. Similarly, none of the key players in the Merleau-Ponty Circle and their annual conferences is included in this volume and there is an emphasis upon what might be called an 'analytic' interpretation of Merleau-Ponty. This is both a strength and a weakness of this volume.

After all, the work of Merleau-Ponty is very useful as a means to eschew the 'representationalism' that still undergirds a lot of analytic philosophy and cognitive science, as well as to combat any reductionism when it comes to adequately thematising the relation between mind and body. This volume takes Merleau-Ponty's work up in relation to analytic philosophy of mind (and science), giving sustained attention to figures as diverse as Wilfrid Sellars, Donald Davidson, Daniel Dennett, Willard Quine, John McDowell, Christopher Peacocke, Gareth Evans, and John Searle. This is particularly so in regard to the essays of Charles Taylor ('Merleau-Ponty and the Epistemological Picture') and Taylor Carman, the latter of whom succinctly outlines Merleau-Ponty's reasons for rejecting intellectualism and empiricism. Mark Wrathall's interesting essay, 'Motives, Reasons and Causes', is also in this vein, and Hubert Dreyfus and Sean Kelly continue their inquiries into the normative importance of developing skills and maintaining an equilibrium for Merleau-Ponty.

At the same time, the neglect of the more avowedly 'continental' interpretation of Merleau-Ponty means that this volume leaves some important questions about his work and its legacy unaddressed. While the editors of this book -- Carman and Hansen -- acknowledge the ongoing debates regarding how to situate Merleau-Ponty in relation to his immediate successors on the French scene (Deleuze, Foucault, Derrida, etc.), it is notable that when they cite one of Deleuze and Guattari's comments about Merleau-Ponty in What is Philosophy? they misconstrue Deleuze and Guattari's position. The account of Merleau-Ponty in What is Philosophy? is far from favourable and certainly does not, as they claim, use "Merleau-Ponty's concept of the flesh as the key to what he calls the being of sensation" (19). On the contrary, for Deleuze and Guattari, Merleau-Ponty's 'pious' notion of the flesh is not up to this job because it remains committed to a version of transcendence (I think that Deleuze and Guattari are wrong in this regard and many of the essays included in this volume indirectly serve to show this). Carman and Hansen also state that Merleau-Ponty's work has not been seriously engaged with by Derrida, yet this is not the case -- Derrida's Memoirs of the Blind and On Touching -- Jean-Luc Nancy both engage with Merleau-Ponty at considerable length. These comments betray the one area that is not covered by the essays included here and because of that some potentially interesting questions aren't really posed. For example, to what extent did Merleau-Ponty's notion of a hyper-dialectic presage the strategy of deconstruction? To what extent might Merleau-Ponty's ultimate ontological position in The Visible and the Invisible achieve a philosophy of immanence that parallels Deleuze's ambitions for his own philosophy? How might his work challenge Derrida's and Deleuze's positions? What kind of influence has Merleau-Ponty's philosophy of the body had upon French feminism and feminism per se, and what disputes has it occasioned? While Carman and Hansen rightly note the 'for' or 'against' logic at work in much of the literature on Merleau-Ponty and his post-structuralist successors, this oppositional tendency is only intimated, rather than argued against, and this is because their book privileges the aspects of Merleau-Ponty's work that are most capable of recuperation within the analytic tradition. It is hard to see, for example, how Merleau-Ponty's The Visible and the Invisible might be read as a "turn away from the anti-humanist radicalisation of ontology" (22), and, by implication, a turn away from post-structuralism. The anti-humanism of this text is stated in multiple places.

More important than these omissions, however, is what The Cambridge Companion to Merleau-Ponty accomplishes. Along with the sustained rapprochement with analytic philosophy, it very effectively and thoroughly situates Merleau-Ponty's work in the context of Husserl's phenomenology. It is also a particularly timely volume, because several of the essays focus on Merleau-Ponty's 'Course Notes' which have only been published in English in the past few years, notably Nature and The Incarnate Subject: Malebranche, Biran, and Bergson on the Union of Body and Soul. These two texts are taken up at length in excellent essays by Judith Butler, Renaud Barbaras, Mark Hansen, and others. Judith Butler's very subtle and nuanced essay, 'Merleau-Ponty and the Touch of Malebranche', traces what The Visible and the Invisible owes to Merleau-Ponty's much earlier engagement with Malebranche in the lectures that have been published as The Incarnate Subject. Recognition of this, she argues, helps us to radicalise The Visible and the Invisible and to foreground as its dominant concern the constitution of subjectivity through touch.

In his essay, 'A Phenomenology of Life', Barbaras traces the importance of Merleau-Ponty's lectures on nature to his ontological position in The Visible and the Invisible. Similarly, Mark Hansen in 'The Embryology of the (In)visible' pursues the question of life and details the importance of evolutionary biology to Merleau-Ponty's later work. Hansen argues that in this light we can see the manner in which Merleau-Ponty's ultimate philosophical position is very much a philosophy of immanence -- the living body's so-called 'transcendence' is simply its belonging to the world. Hansen also suggests that Merleau-Ponty's work provides us with the resources to view the philosophy/science relation without: a) either reducing the significance of human intentionality; or b) privileging it hierarchically over other lower-order organisms. Because of this, he suggests that Merleau-Ponty can avoid the extreme interpretations of this relation offered by Daniel Dennett and Francisco Varela. In 'Merleau-Ponty's Existential Conception of Science', Joseph Rouse also explores Merleau-Ponty's conception of science, but pays more attention to Merleau-Ponty's early works -- The Structure of Behaviour and Phenomenology of Perception rather than The Visible and the Invisible -- and the two essays hence complement each other well.

Richard Shusterman's essay, 'The Silent, Limping Body of Philosophy', simplifies Merleau-Ponty's position so that it can be denigrated for not allowing of something akin to the Alexander technique of deliberate bodily reflection. Shusterman seems to misunderstand the complexity of habit and skill development, instead insisting that in Merleau-Ponty's work there is a "polarisation of lived experience versus representations that neglects the fruitful option of 'lived corporeal reflection'" (165). As Dreyfus' essay in this very book brings out, representational thought is not 'irrelevant', as Shusterman declares. Rather, it is an important aspect of learning a skill, but it is based upon a pre-reflective engagement with the world and cannot be divorced from this. This does not preclude techniques of bodily reflection, which can and may well be useful. Strangely, Shusterman goes on to suggest that Merleau-Ponty's 'lived body' is always the observing subject (174), and he responds that "to treat the lived body as a subject does not require treating it only as a purely transcendental subject that can also be observed as an empirical one" (174). That, of course, is not Merleau-Ponty's point (in fact, it seems more accurate of Sartre, whose account of the body Merleau-Ponty criticises at some length). For Merleau-Ponty, our experience is fundamentally not one of an 'observing subject', which he would characterise as 'high-altitude thinking'. While he would not admit of a fusion of the experiences of touching and being touched, he would insist that touching and being touched encroach upon one another in such a way that there is no pure touching, no pure seeing, and no pure transcendental subject. What is touched (the world) ramifies upon the touching (the subject), and this is precisely what ensures ambiguity.

As with most of the other Cambridge Companions, the last three essays in this book focus upon Merleau-Ponty's views on, and significance for, art and politics. His influential work on art is taken up by Jonathan Gilmore, who argues that Merleau-Ponty's three key essays on art extend and develop his philosophical views, but themselves offer no 'philosophy of art' (292). Interestingly, this is precisely what Deleuze and Guattari also claim in What is Philosophy? when they ponder, and doubt, whether Merleau-Ponty's concept of the flesh is adequate to art, to what they call the "being of sensation" (WP 178-9). In her provocative essay, Lydia Goehr juxtaposes the engaged philosopher, Merleau-Ponty, against the committed writer and public political figure, Sartre, and examines their long relationship with each other's thought, especially as it plays out in the political realm and their eventual acrimonious parting. Goehr suggests that the content of their respective political positions and relation to Marxism was largely similar (might it not be said that they moved in opposing directions, that Sartre began further from Marxism but eventually moved closer, whereas Merleau-Ponty began closer to Marxism in texts like Humanism and Terror but then moved further away?). For Goehr, however, where Sartre and Merleau-Ponty most clearly differed was on the question of the form of any political engagement. In this respect, she contrasts the polemical engagement of Sartre with the philosophical engagement of Merleau-Ponty, and examines the latter's suggestions that the role of the philosopher should be situated in contradistinction to those of the politician and the artist. Suggesting that Merleau-Ponty advocates neither the apolitical engagement of the artist, nor the engaged action of the politician, she asks whether his own political 'middle way' becomes ineffectual. Although Goehr does not pursue this, arguably some of the questions that she raises about the form of Merleau-Ponty's politics also apply to some of the contemporary post-structuralist thinkers who offer related reasons for resisting the Sartrean conception of the committed intellectual. Claude Lefort also examines political issues in his essay 'Thinking Politics', offering a more sympathetic overview of Merleau-Ponty's relation to Marx and Marxism. This juxtaposition of two essays following one another on similar topics, but from diverse viewpoints, is characteristic of this volume. Whether or not it was deliberate, it is both apt and productive; it opens questions and issues up for further thought, rather than presuming to offer some kind of final verdict on this long dead philosopher, and this is something that Merleau-Ponty's own 'hyper-dialectical' thought would welcome.