The Cambridge Companion to Modern Jewish Philosophy

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Michael L. Morgan and Peter Eli Gordon (eds.), The Cambridge Companion to Modern Jewish Philosophy, Cambridge University Press, 2007, 382pp., $24.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521012553.

Reviewed by Abraham Socher, Oberlin College


In 1916, Isaac Husik ended his still-useful History of Medieval Jewish Philosophy on an elegiac note: "There are Jews now and there are philosophers, but there are no Jewish philosophers and there is no Jewish philosophy."  Although Husik's epitaph isn't mentioned, the contributors and editors of the new Cambridge Companion to Modern Jewish Philosophy repeatedly and even worriedly address the question of whether there is any such distinctively philosophical sub-field through which the reader must be guided.

In a certain sense, the question is trivial: there are evidently enough distinguished philosophers who fall under the rubric "Modern Jewish Philosophy" to fill a Cambridge Companion: Spinoza, Mendelssohn, Solomon Maimon, Hermann Cohen, Buber, Rosenzweig, Levinas, Emil Fackenheim and so on.  Given that there are no widely accepted, let alone definitive, answers to the questions of what constitutes modernity, philosophy, or, for that matter, Judaism, this editorial fact may be all the answer one needs.  (Though on this point even the Press seems tempted to follow Husik: whereas the Cambridge Companion to Medieval Jewish Philosophy (2003) was listed among the philosophical Companions, the volume under review falls under its Religion list.)

Nonetheless, the question is a real one.  Spinoza was, perhaps, as deeply influenced by Moses Maimonides as he was by Descartes, but he used the tools, concepts and tropes of medieval Jewish philosophy (and mysticism) to leave Judaism -- and revealed religion more generally -- behind, as would Salomon Maimon, the brilliant post-Kantian, a century later, as contributors Steven Nadler and Paul Franks respectively make clear.  Allan Arkush, the translator of the definitive English version of Moses Mendelssohn's Jerusalem (1783), persuasively argues that the book is a rhetorical triumph but a self-conscious philosophical failure in its attempt to reconcile rabbinic Judaism and the modern liberal polity.  Since these are the three starting points offered as founding moments of modern Jewish philosophy, one begins to wonder.  Into the twentieth century, and at the other end of the intellectual spectrum, is Martin Buber of whom a basically sympathetic Emil Fackenheim once wondered whether he was really a philosopher at all, or rather, a "Hebrew sage in modern garb."

Specific texts and thinkers aside, however, the argument that Jewish philosophy is oxymoronic would have to rely on a strong and necessarily controversial account of what philosophy tout court is.  Interestingly, there is one figure discussed by Steven Smith, and mentioned by several other contributors, who made such a claim.  According to Leo Strauss, Philosophy is and always has been the activity of questioning, which in its insistence upon presuppositionless inquiry necessarily precludes any claims of revelation.  "According to the Bible," Strauss says,

the beginning of wisdom is fear of the Lord; according to the Greek philosophers it is wonder … We [moderns] are not wise but we wish to become wise.  By saying that we wish to hear first and to act to decide, we have already decided in favor of Athens against Jerusalem.

Jerusalem, according to Strauss, requires the response of biblical Israel, in the Book of Exodus: "we will do and [then] we will hear [understand]" -- the always-already acceptance -- which philosophy cannot allow.  Athens asks a question to which Jerusalem's answer is irrelevant.  The argument so far is broadly Kantian: religion in general, and Judaism in particular, is a heteronomous system, when both philosophy and modernity call for autonomy.  Then comes the Straussian twist: Jewish philosophy was as much of an oxymoron in the middle ages as it is now, though it was also, and still ought to be, a noble political necessity, because not everyone is capable of presuppositionless autonomy.  Society requires religious heteronomy, about which the philosopher should tread lightly.

Kenneth Seeskin thinks otherwise.  In his chapter, entitled "Ethics, Authority and Autonomy," he makes the strong interpretive claim that Judaism, or at least the most important strain of it, has been directed precisely at enabling its adherents to achieve moral and intellectual autonomy.  "From a Kantian perspective," Seeskin writes, "the importance of Sinai is not the fact of its occurrence but the legitimacy of its content … [it] is simply the Torah's way of saying that the commandments were not just given, but given and agreed to."  This is one way to interpret the underlying meaning of the biblical claim of revelation, but it is by no means the only one, or even the most textually plausible.  Seeskin knows this and would, like Hermann Cohen, simply insist upon privileging the Kantian reading of his favored passages.  The more difficult part of the task is applying this to the Rabbinic account of Jewish law (Halakha) and, in particular, the laws of ritual practices.  Cohen's approach here was adumbrated in the title of his great, posthumously published book, Religion of Reason out of the Sources of Judaism.  Whether Seeskin would go quite so far in arguing that Judaism is not itself a "religion of reason," but contains the material out of which one might be quarried, is left a bit ambiguous here, though Seeskin has addressed the issues at much greater length elsewhere.

In his chapter on the thought of the distinguished talmudist and essayist, Rabbi Joseph Soloveitchik, Lawrence Kaplan argues that in his most important works, Halakhic Man and Halakhic Mind, Soloveitchik (who wrote a doctoral dissertation on Cohen's epistemology under Cassirer) was also defending the Rabbinic tradition against the charges of heteronomy.  Unfortunately, Kaplan, who is Soloveitchik's best translator and one of his leading expositors, attempts to do this while giving a conspectus, or cook's tour, of all of Soloveitchik's major essays.  The result is a bit dizzying.

As the paragraphs above suggest, the figures and issues discussed in the Cambridge Companion to Modern Jewish Philosophy are almost all engaged more or less directly with challenges posed by Kant and the tradition of German Idealism.  The reasons for this are complex and even -- given the fate of German Jewry -- tragic.  Paul Franks offers an interesting explanation for the historical affinity of Jewish and Kantian philosophy that I have not seen before: they are both deeply indebted to the Platonic tradition.  Maimonides had already recast Judaism as a Platonized Aristotelian system, and (as Franks might have added) the opposing medieval tradition of Kabbala, or Jewish mysticism, is a largely Neo-Platonic system.  Here, as elsewhere, one wishes that Franks had more space to develop his suggestive remarks.  But that is simply a feature of the genre of the Companion collections, which require contributors to cover a great deal of material within a small compass.

One is left with the question of the prospects for Jewish philosophy.  In The Claim of Reason, Stanley Cavell wrote that "philosophy is the criticism a culture produces of itself, and proceeds essentially by criticizing past efforts at this criticism."  Whether the philosophers discussed here succeeded by this standard is open to question, but any future Jewish philosopher will have to proceed from a criticism of their efforts.