The Cambridge Companion to the "Origin of Species"

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Michael Ruse and Robert J. Richards (eds.), The Cambridge Companion to the "Origin of Species", Cambridge University Press, 2009, 395pp., $28.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521691291.

Reviewed by Jonathan Hodge, University of Leeds


It will be as well to begin with a clarification and a declaration of interest. As readers of NDPR will know, Cambridge University Press has for some years now been publishing a series of volumes on the philosophers: their Cambridge Companion series. A few of these volumes have been devoted to scientists. There is one on Darwin, now out in a second edition. It is edited by Gregory Radick and myself. The same press has also been publishing a series of Companion volumes on particular books. The volume under review here is devoted to Darwin's Origin of Species, first published in 1859. There is only a little overlap between the two Companion volumes. Each has a chapter by John Brooke discussing Darwin's religious views, but the emphasis is different enough that interested readers will want to consult both. Again, Darwin's analogy between natural and artificial selection is discussed in both volumes and also naturally enough his theory of natural selection. There is no chapter in the Origin volume on the structure of the whole argument of that book. However there is a chapter -- by the philosopher of biology, Kenneth Waters -- on just that in the Darwin Companion. As for philosophy: the Origin volume has only one chapter (by Tim Lewens) by a philosopher writing with philosophers in mind. The Darwin Companion has half a dozen.

The contents of this Origin volume are diverse. The editors' introduction usefully gives synopses of all the chapters. After the short first chapter, by Michael Ruse, on how and why Darwin came to write the Origin as he did, the remaining chapters fall into four groups. The first group is devoted to the topics Darwin himself takes up in his book, in the order he adopted. So we have a chapter each on: the selection analogy, variation and inheritance, natural selection, species, the principle of divergence, the objections Darwin anticipated and countered, geology, biogeography, classification, and embryology and morphology. Then there is a second group, of three chapters: on Darwin's botany, on his rhetoric, and on his religion. Next come three chapters on the legacies: for literature; for political thought, and for philosophy. Finally, there is a chapter on the Origin as a book rather than a text: its production, publication, sales and so on.

In the first group, those exegetical chapters all make valuable contributions to our understanding of Darwin's concepts and arguments. Obviously a mere twenty or so pages of print hardly allows for a comprehensive analysis of the issues raised by even one topic, and some of the authors rightly refer us to more extended treatments elsewhere. Phillip Sloan directs us to the books and papers of David Stamos on Darwin's species concepts; Sandra Herbert and David Norman direct us to Herbert's own monograph on Darwin as a geologist. Darwin specialists will have various individual reasons for valuing particular moments in these exegetical chapters. I know I am not alone in finding it difficult to work out just how Darwin's arguments go when he is articulating his principle of divergence, and when he is relating present embryonic developments to past ancestral descents -- ontogenies to phylogenies. On divergence, Darwin is evidently arguing that because natural selection favors structural and functional specialists over nonspecialists, it will tend over time to make co-descendent species not just more and more unlike their common ancestors but more and more unlike each other. However, as the late Dov Ospovat and his friend David Kohn have long brought out, there is far more to it than that; if only because, on Darwin's mature view, it is specialisation that constitutes progress. As a result, his account of the causes of adaptive divergence is also an account of the causes of progress. Kohn's chapter takes these and related matters on to higher levels of archival detail and explicative clarity than we have had before. It is a pity perhaps that he did not discuss Stephen Gould's extended analysis of Darwin and divergence and species selection. In his book of 2002, The Structure of Evolutionary Theory. Lynn Nyhart's discussion of Darwin on embryology and morphology makes clearer than before, not only what is often obscure in Darwin's relating of ontogeny to phylogeny, but also what is correct and what not in Robert Richards' exegeses in his book of 1992, the Meaning of Evolution, and in Gould's book of 1977, Ontogeny and Phylogeny.

In the second group of chapters, Betty Smocovitis's on Darwin's botany is informative and insightful but does not, in my view, show that much is gained by dividing off Darwin's views on plants in the Origin from his views on animals. And in any case why not have also a chapter on his zoology? David Depew's study of Darwin's rhetoric is judicious but concentrates too little on the structuring of the book's overall argument. He rightly focuses on issues of theodicy and providence, and so makes good links with John Brooke on the Origin and religion. The theory of natural selection was first constructed by a young Christian Darwin, and later published in the Origin by a middle-aged deist Darwin who would eventually become more an agnostic. Brooke rightly suggests that it was reflection on the death of his father -- and on the then-orthodox Anglican Christian teaching that his unChristian father was now due for eternal, hellish punishment -- rather than reflection on the death of his daughter Annie, that was probably decisive for Darwin's loss of Christianity, a decade or so before the Origin appeared. Later, in the 1860s, Asa Gray's efforts to integrate theism and natural selection may have unwittingly helped Darwin's move to agnosticism. On one point of terminology, Brooke is to be commended. Historians writing on science and religion often invoke an improper contrast between theists and deists. This is improper because, on one standard usage, a theist is simply someone who believes in God, and deists have been just as much believers in God as any other theists; so deists are a species of the genus theist. What deists did not believe in is the Bible as a divine revelation. Many deists, Darwin's mentor Charles Lyell for one, even though not believing in that revelation, nor then in the distinctive doctrines of Christianity, nevertheless believed in God's miraculous creation of mankind, an afterlife, a divine moral government, and so on. The 1967 Encyclopedia of Philosophy, edited by Paul Edwards, has an antidote to all sorts of errors about deists in an excellent article on deism by Hume's biographer, Ernest Mossner.

Turning back now to that third group of chapters, Gillian Beer, writing on the Origin's literary progeny, has some engaging quotations from writers over the last century and a half but offers us no arguments in favor of any challenging generalisations about Darwin and literature. Naomi Beck, on political thought, concentrates on Spencer and Marx but without breaking new ground in any major way. Book history has been a respectable field for some decades now. M. and C. Kohler provide more on the Origin than anyone else has to date.

The last chapter but one finds Tim Lewens facing an impossible task in writing briefly on the Origin and philosophy. He begins by declaring that "Darwinism is all the rage in philosophy these days." Readers will know what he is getting at, even if they may just wonder whether he has in mind the university that houses NDPR, but then maybe 'all the rage' can have more than one meaning here. He explains that he is largely digesting his book, Darwin, published in a series on the philosophers by Routledge in 2006 and reviewed helpfully and supportively in NDPR on 2007.03.24 by Michael Ghiselin. I too wish to commend that book to readers. It is the best introductory-but-sophisticated book we have exploring philosophical themes in Darwin's own writings and also connecting those themes with what philosophers have been doing lately with Darwinian issues and resources. One reason for Darwinism being taken very seriously by some philosophers today is surely the postanalytic revival of preanalytic, Darwinian naturalisms. This revival which has given us, for example, Daniel Dennett as the Herbert Spencer of our time, with the decisive difference that for Spencer it was the law of evolution (everything physical and social goes from homogeneity to heterogeneity) that was the universal explanatory solvent rather than natural selection (of genes, memes and other replicators). Another subsidiary reason has been perhaps the loss of philosophical credibility (and general cred) suffered lately by Freud and Marx, a loss leaving Darwin and Dewey -- or if you prefer, Frege, or if you must, Nietzsche -- and one or two others, as the nineteenth-century ancestors of choice today.

Lewens has fresh things to say about Darwin and typological versus populational thinking. The contrast has been familiar enough ever since the late Ernst Mayr elaborated it, around the time of the 1959 centennial, to go with a grand narrative about Darwin as the heroic overturner of two millennia of Platonism. Mayr aligned himself with Lovejoy's classic history of the originally-Platonic idea of a scala naturae, and so by implication with Whitehead's daft oneliner about all subsequent philosophy being so many footnotes to Plato. Mayr later joined Popper in using the word essentialism to cover all versions of original Platonic sin. Mayr seems to have been unaware that Dewey had said similar things in 1909. What can be called the Dewey-Mayr thesis on the long run of Western thought has now had itself a long enough run for its money. As Lewens points out, some historians have started to question the value of going on with it. The Cambridge Companion to Darwin, in its new edition, has discussions of the various issues involved, including those issues arising when one asks whether the assumptions typically made about human nature by Aristotelian ethical philosophies can be reconciled with Darwinian biological theory old or new.

Standing back and asking what this companion to the Origin has to offer, the answer has to be favorable. Anyone taking or teaching a course on the book would find it very helpful indeed. It could have been made more helpful if the editors and contributors had been more concerned to have it reflect the state of the art and the literature in specialist Darwin scholarship and in specialist philosophy of biology; if they had offered suggestions for further reading (the Darwin volume has a little, including a couple of key websites); and if more attention had been paid to how the parts of their volume relate to the whole, and likewise for Darwin's book itself.