The Cambridge Companion to the Philosophy of Biology

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David L. Hull and Michael Ruse (eds.), The Cambridge Companion to the Philosophy of Biology, Cambridge University Press, 2007, 513pp., $34.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521616713.

Reviewed by David Depew, University of Iowa



The core mission of the philosophy of biology, since it morphed into a technical discipline by the end of the 60s, is to analyze the key concepts of biology with a view to assessing the coherence, if not the empirical adequacy, of theories in the life sciences. It is especially concerned with concepts in evolutionary biology, and among these with the network of concepts that form the architecture of genetical Darwinism, the dominant family of explanatory theories in the life sciences. Necessarily, philosophers of biology are also concerned with how concepts and theories in the life sciences relate to standing topics in the philosophy of science, such as laws, reduction, explanation, and teleology.

Nine of the twenty-three papers in this Cambridge Companion are about the conceptual structure of evolutionary theory or its relation to general issues in the philosophy of science. Others review, and often judge, the viability of current research programs in various biological fields that the Modern Evolutionary Synthesis hoped, sometimes in vain, to unify around genetical Darwinism. There are essays on macroevolution, systematics, developmental biology, and ecology. The editors also include a generous helping of essays about research into human evolution, neurobiology, evolutionary psychology, human sexuality, the effects of humans on other species, and the implications of evolutionary theory for religion and politics. The breadth of the resulting collection can lead to a long review. To make matters manageable, I will divide the papers into the four topical clusters discriminated above.

The first cluster of essays is about key concepts in genetical Darwinism: adaptation, fitness, natural selection, genetic drift, gene, information, and units of selection. These essays are often more technical than they seem at first sight. (Uninitiated readers might even be advised to read the book backward.) The first essay is about the process of adaptation, the state of adaptedness, and the traits we call adaptations. Its author, Tim Lewens, rightly notes that these concepts come trailing clouds of theological glory. In Darwin’s hands, natural selection was assumed to explain phenomena whose reference was already fixed by the hypothesis of intelligent design. To this day an adaptation is supposed to exhibit “good engineering design” or at least to name traits that have been “created” by natural selection “for” a specific biological function. The first notion has no necessary connection with evolution. The second does, but brings with it puzzles that Lewens explores. Adaptations, it would appear, are traits that get “built” over a succession of generations by concerted reinforcement of just those heritable variations in an interbreeding population that fit their possessors to live in and from a specific environment more successfully than competing populations. On this definition, however, the first incidence of a fitness-enhancing trait in an organism that “happens” to have it will not be an adaptation even if it is ex hypothesi descriptively identical with the same trait in later generations. Then, too, natural selection might well have shaped traits like the appendix that no longer contribute to fitness. Are they adaptations? Again, suppose that

members of a population slowly move until they find a habitat in which some preexisting, unchanged trait enhances fitness … . It is misleading to say that the fact of the adaptedness [of the ‘trait’ ‘being in a better habitat’] indicates selective design in this scenario. (13)

If your conception of adaptation requires design this doesn’t seem to be an adaptation.

Lewens points out that these difficulties disappear or diminish if design, with or without a designer, no longer serves to identify adaptations. In that event, stereotyped examples going back to William Paley will be disempowered. But Lewens also suggests at the end of his essay that the concept of adaptation remains too tightly connected to its theological antecedent for it to change its connotations or disappear any time soon. I add that this is especially true if biologists and creationists keep taking each other’s bait by fixing the reference of “an adaptation” in the same way. In that case they will continue to privilege talk about either God or natural selection as the “designer” of “an” adaptation rather than speaking about the process of adaptation and states of relative adaptedness that arise not accidentally, to be sure, but purely naturally.

Darwin’s theory of adaptation by natural selection might have failed to evolve into a mature science if population genetics, the subject of Roberta Millstein and Robert Skipper’s chapter, had not come to the rescue. Among many other advantages, the statistical nature of population genetics offered help in deflecting the “tautology problem” that had dogged nineteenth century Darwinism. According to this objection the claim that offspring that survive are more fit is explanatorily empty since fitness is determined by actual survival. Of course the fit survive. That’s who the fit are. Statistical Darwinism helps by distinguishing between natural selection, which Millstein and Skipper call “a discriminate sampling process in which physical differences between biological entities are causally relevant to differences in fitness,” and genetic drift, in which chance rather than selection spreads genotypes in populations (34). To show that natural selection is not tautologically responsible for a trait all one has to do is beat the null hypothesis of drift by using statistical tests to measure deviation from randomness.

Recently, this reassuring solution has come under attack in papers that, though they are rebutted in this volume, are not represented in it. According to André Ariew and Mohan Matthen, the statistical nature of modern Darwinism implies that drift imports its own threats of explanatory emptiness (Matthen & Ariew, 2002; Walsh, Lewens & Ariew, 2002). Drift is a function of population size. Its probability goes up as population size goes down. So it tells us little or nothing about anything else. Moreover, if drift is predicable only of a statistical ensemble, and not of the particulars that do the drifting, so too natural selection must be a purely emergent statistical phenomenon if it is to be mathematically aggregated with drift and other factors in evolutionary scenarios.

In their essay on genetic drift, Robert Brandon and Grant Ramsey are incensed (there is no other word for it) by this argument. It might be true of Fisherian (as in R. A. Fisher) fitness, which is merely average reproductive success across generations, but it is not true of the concept of expected fitness which, according to Brandon and Ramsey, working evolutionary biologists actually use and philosophers of biology have labored to conceptually analyze. Expected fitness either is identical with or based on relative adaptedness. Relative adaptedness is a propensity or disposition to reproduce successfully that arises from those “physical differences between biological entities [that] are causally relevant to differences in” ability to reproduce. These propensities, Brandon and Ramsey argue, are as deeply rooted in individual organisms as the physical properties that cause loaded dice to fall more often on one facet than on others. They differ only in that fitness propensities are more fundamentally probabilistic.

Brandon and Ramsey gleefully show evolutionary biologists in the field not only aiming at, but actually achieving selectionist explanations by making use of expected fitness, thereby doing what Ariew and Matthen say they cannot do. The rub is that one is justified in empirically finding adaptive natural selection at work only in particular environments whose dynamics are invariably complicated by many factors, making for a painstaking, case-by-case sort of inquiry in which success in one case has heuristic, but not deductive relevance to others.

The focus of evolutionary biologists on individual cases allows what Elliott Sober perhaps inappropriately called “forces” such as mutation pressure, selection, drift, and migration — the force metaphor is what drew Ariew’s and Matthen’s fire — to be aggregated. Admittedly, these factors combine in ways that do not accord well with the mathematical analogy between natural selection and statistical physics that bewitched Fisher. But this does not mean that the conclusions of evolutionary biologists are not as well grounded in experiment and controlled observation as in any other mature mathematized science. Nor does it mean that results in one case are inapplicable to others. It simply means that as evolutionary biologists move from case to case, using whatever generalizations, models, and mechanisms they can muster, they are engaged in what is, inevitably, an interpretive science.

Many people chafe at this conclusion. One reason is that the magical mid-twentieth century moment when the functional concept of the gene came to be identified with a physical structure — stretches of DNA that by means of RNA produce amino acids, which fold up into different proteins and in turn determine different cell types, tissues, and functional organs — gave rise to the conceit that genes “contain” “coded information” and that in making an organism a computer-like “genetic program” downloads this information. This seems to make a general biological theory possible after all — a law-governed computational theory whose currency is information rather than, as in physics, energy.

The chapters by Paul Griffiths and Karola Stolz on the gene concept and by Peter Godfrey-Smith on biological information throw cold water on this aspiration. Griffiths and Stolz record an exponentially growing awareness in molecular genetics of the complexity and dynamism of the genotype-phenotype relation. It is difficult to think of the latter as “read out only” from the former. This difficulty has led to a situation in which institutional efforts to keep gene function and gene structure tied together have produced what Robert Fogle has called the “consensus gene” and Richard Burian dubs the “nominal gene.” Both notions refer to the rapidly growing bank of gene sequences deposited in data bases that contemporary evolutionary biologists dip into in order to frame and answer their questions about function. According to Griffiths and Stolz, however, “the ‘consensus gene’ hides both the diversity of DNA sequences that can perform the same function and the diverse functions of particular DNA sequences” (101).

So telling are these facts that some think they might undermine the very notions of “genetic information” and “genetic program.” Developmental systems theorists such as Griffiths, Susan Oyama, and Lenny Moss think they do, asserting that genes have no greater prima facie causal role than other factors at work in ontogeny. For his part, Godfrey-Smith is happy enough with the notion of genetic information, if not genetic program, as long as it is confined to sequence information within the context of protein production. What better metaphor is there than “coded information” to represent the fact that “there is one kind of informational or semantic property that genes and only genes have: coding for the amino acid sequences of protein molecules?” But, Godfrey-Smith continues, “this idea ‘reaches’ only as far as the amino acid sequence. It does not validate the idea that genes code for whole-organism phenotypes” (110). By suppressing layer after layer of complexity, efforts to confine “whole organism phenotypes” within the notion of coded information produce “reification” (114) and “mystification” (113).

Genocentrism of the sort Godfrey-Smith criticizes gives the impression that every factor in evolutionary dynamics other than adaptive natural selection is of little importance. This neo-Fisherian thesis is known as “empirical adaptationism” (20). In spite of its problems it pervades pop evolutionary theory. In this connection, Godfrey-Smith reiterates a long standing tendency among philosophers of biology to be critical of Richard Dawkins’s “selfish gene” hypothesis, which turns the received view of genetical Darwinism on its head by moving from the fact that “sequence information is preserved over many replication events” to the striking conclusion that the longevity of types (not tokens) of “immortal replicators” is the very point of adaptive natural selection. Godfrey-Smith suspects that this reformulation of genetical Darwinism flirts with informational mysticism (113).

In her chapter on the units of selection controversy — does natural selection select genes, organisms, groups, or species? — Elizabeth Lloyd, a very careful reader of arguments, is also critical of Dawkins, but no less critical of the way some philosophers of biology have interpreted and reproached him. The consensus has certainly been anti-Dawkins. But he is often taken as saying that phenotypes at the organismic level are coded for by relatively small chunks of DNA, a reading that allows the critic to attribute mystified causal powers to Dawkins’s “selfish genes” by ascribing to him a new version of the old one-gene-one-trait fallacy. But, Lloyd notes, Dawkins’s stipulatively defined “gene,” qua paradigmatic replicator, can in principle be as large as a whole genome (61). It is also wrong, she says, to assume that for Dawkins “the presence of an interactor at a given level [of selection] is a manifestor of an adaptation at that level” (49). An interactor is a trait that, in doing battle with the environment, causes the genes that specify it to proliferate. Organocentric Darwinians have sometimes implied that Dawkins should hold that organisms, not genes, are the privileged beneficiaries of selection because on his own view interactors are adaptations, organisms are assemblies of adaptations, and adaptations are good making, hence beneficial, traits of organisms. This argument misfires because Dawkins does not hold that interactors must be adaptations at their level of interaction. Still, Lloyd argues that Dawkins does not establish his own claim that genes, with their longevity, are the only beneficiaries of selection.

Many of the issues considered so far have been raised in earlier collections of essays on the philosophy of biology. Indeed, some readers may find them more clearly posed, though perhaps not more successfully addressed, in the first and second editions of Sober’s Conceptual Issues in Evolutionary Biology. The essays in this Cambridge Companion were written by second and third generation workers in a field whose fruits the editors, who are founders of that field, have every reason to be proud. But for the very reason that Hull and Ruse’s authors are fishing downstream from philosophy of biology’s headwaters, some readers may find it useful to orient themselves to the key issues in the field by first working through earlier collections, as well as through one or more textbooks on philosophy of biology.

If they do, they will find it hard to miss the fact that some worries that were once prominent in philosophy of biology have withered away. The most salient of these is whether evolutionary biology is governed by scientific laws, and, if so, whether these laws apply tightly enough to their supposed instances to make evolutionary biology a science in the same sense and league as physics. So vexing was this question in the heyday of logical empiricism that it was largely responsible for the emergence of philosophy of biology in the first place. So recessive has this once burning question now become, however, that the notion of scientific law is not even indexed in the Cambridge Companion. In fact laws are mentioned in the text more than once. But they are usually mentioned either in scare quotes (375) or in connection with the claim that in evolutionary biology there aren’t any (123). Noting this sea-change, I turn to a cluster of chapters about how evolutionary theory fares with respect to issues in the philosophy of science such as reductionism, explanation, mechanism, and the problematic of teleology.

The testimony of Alexander Rosenberg that there are no laws in evolutionary biology, and even more that “there can be no [such] laws” (123), is especially credible since no one has looked harder for them than he. In his chapter on reductionism and anti-reductionism in biology, Rosenberg’s reason for denying the very possibility of laws in evolutionary biology, or at least in genetical Darwinism, is that there cannot be a law that connects functional items like adapted phenotypes with structural items like genes. The former, having their source in natural selection, are too heterogeneous a class to be so connected. The latter are homogeneous enough, but are connected to effects through chemical and physical, not biological, laws. For this reason, Rosenberg argues that there can be no reduction of biological theory, or at least of Darwinian biological theory, to molecular biological theory. On this point, Griffiths, Stolz, and Godfrey-Smith would surely agree. But, unlike Rosenberg, who remains faithful to logical empiricist ideals, they do not lament the loss. For his part, Rosenberg predicts that the contemporary cascade of discoveries into biological mechanisms will ultimately result in a biomolecular replacement of genetic Darwinism, and even the concept of the gene, by a harder science.

Readers who compare earlier collections of essays in the philosophy of biology with the present volume may notice the disappearance not only of evolutionary laws, but also of the received theory of explanation based on them. They may notice, that is, the disappearance of the notion that a scientific explanation, as distinct from a psychologically satisfying explication, is a deduction of a fact from a general law. This once dominant view has been displaced by the idea that explanation is an inference to the best causal account of a given phenomenon, laws or no laws. This conception first emerged in connection with demands for greater realism than logical empiricism, with its phenomenalist roots, could ever muster. It allows for more realism in part because, as Lindley Darden puts it in her chapter on mechanisms and models, the view attributes to mechanisms “the roles attributed to general scientific theories. They provide explanations of puzzling phenomena. They enable biologists to make predictions” (139). For Darden, mechanisms perform these roles because they reveal “productive continuity between stages [of a phenomenon] … . The entities and activities of each stage give rise to the next stage” (141). Such mechanisms, she reports, are discovered through and subsequently represented by models. These include “model organisms” like the estimable fruit fly, which has done yeoman service in the development of evolutionary theory for over a century.

Inference to the best explanation is often invoked in order preserve the adequacy and autonomy of adaptationist explanations in the face of reductionist prophecies like those of Rosenberg. Does not natural selection remain the best explanation of adaptation even if it is not “covered by” laws? At the same time, neo-Paleyan intelligent design advocates, who are as quick as their creationist predecessors to turn the latest ideas of philosophers of science against evolution, have found their way to inference to the best explanation in order to push the notion that intelligent design, not natural selection, is the best explanation of putatively irreducibly complex biochemical mechanisms. This argument depends in part on the notion that organisms contain “molecular machines.” But, as Darden points out, not every mechanism is a machine. Nor are organisms as wholes mechanisms unless one arbitrarily imposes an engineering or artifact paradigm on entities that on closer inspection seem to be “built … by tinkering and satisficing” (142). Nor, finally, is there anything machine-like about the mechanisms by which lineages of organisms are explained, “such as the isolating mechanisms leading to speciation” (142). These considerations hark back to the issues about adaptation raised at the outset.

Exorcising the spectre of intelligent design is the overt goal of André Ariew’s essay on biological teleology. Inference to intentional design as the best explanation of organic functions depends on invoking efficient means-end reasoning. If that is what Darwin meant by teleology, intelligent design might have a prayer. But, Ariew argues, Darwin’s teleology is more like Aristotle’s than Paley’s. No less than Aristotle, Darwin thought of organisms not as an assembly site where separate traits favored by a particular environment happened to collect, but as outcomes of an integrated, end-oriented process of development. To be sure, unlike Aristotle, Darwin thought that beneficial changes in this process, rather than its perpetual repetition or degeneration, needed explaining and he appealed to natural selection in conjunction with strong heredity to do the explaining. Still, attending to the developmental context seems just the right antidote to the provincial, design-based conception of teleological explanation that for historical reasons dominates Anglophone cultures. Its ordered end-orientation undercuts the widespread assumption that the only alternative to design is pure chance, a misunderstanding that has dogged Darwinism from the outset. Nonetheless, I think Ariew fails fully to exploit the analogy to Aristotle when he claims that for Darwin natural selection is not the author of inherited biological form, but merely of traits that show tinkering with local constraints. The Origin of Species does not draw the contrast this way.

I turn now to chapters on the state of play in biological fields that the Modern Evolutionary Synthesis hoped to attract to its population genetical core. It made progress with adaptive radiation and speciation. But by the l980s its expectation of eventually capturing developmental biology, ecology, and phylogeny — the three core disciplines of what might be called the old, l9th century evolutionary synthesis — began to stall. Partly as a result of the belated discovery that genetic architecture is highly conserved across lineages and the inference that differences must be due to the interaction between genes and other factors in the ontogenetic process, developmental biology has reemerged strongly in recent decades. Jane Maienschein shows that the epigenetic roots of developmentalism contrast with the weak preformationism of the “genetic program” trope that in the l960s fused genetical Darwinism with post-Watson and Crick molecular genetics. Experimental work on stem cells, for example, has been going on since the first decade of the 20th century; it only appears to have recently come out of nowhere because the preformationist bias of genetic Darwinism had screened this work from view.

In a similar spirit, Manfred Laubichler gives a genealogy of evo-devo and devo-evo research programs, which hold that evolutionary changes cannot simply be functions of changes of gene frequencies in populations. “The same differences that lead to differentiation of cells in the course of individual development (ontogeny),” writes Laubichler, “also account for emerging differences in the course of evolution (phylogeny)” (354). I should mention, because the Cambridge Companion does not, that some philosophers who prefer Fisher’s causally inert conception of fitness over the propensity interpretation do so in order to shift the explanatory focus from population dynamics back to variations that emerge in the course of individual development (Walsh, 2006). For them population dynamics is really just population kinetics.

What about ecology? In the 1960s, serious efforts were made to bring community ecology into the Modern Synthesis by mathematically modeling competition between species. In his chapter on the field’s current state, however, Gregory Mikkleson argues against reductionist biases which, in treating ecologies as closed systems of competing species, miss the fact that even on islands these systems are usually open to migration. In open systems, Mikkleson says, migration cannot simply be added as one more “force” to the see-saw between competing plants and animals. That is because when the reductionistic biases associated with closed systems are removed it is as likely as not that the appropriate level of causal interaction will also shift to higher levels and units, such as “metapopulations, metacommunities, landscapes, regions, biotic provinces, or at the largest scale to date, the entire biosphere or ecosphere” (376).

The relevance of development and the ecology of open systems, as well as the limits of reductionism, are also themes in Kim Sterelny’s informative chapter on macroevolution. By way of a fascinating review of literature on evolutionary trends and major evolutionary transitions, especially the Cambrian explosion of bilaterian metazoa, Sterelny shows that the Modern Synthesis’s gambit of treating all macroevolution as extrapolation from population genetical microevolution is inadequate. To be sure, this “minimalist approach,” as Sterelny calls it, is superior to Stephen Jay Gould’s neo-saltationist notion that macroevolution is dominated by chance. In the Cambrian, however, developmental changes that were already afoot resulted in taxa that were able to affect, not just adjust to, environmental contingencies. Their enhanced agency was made possible by preadaptive modular construction, increasingly powerful nervous systems and sensory organs, and complex life histories. Accordingly, Sterelny concludes that “the diversification pulse in the Cambrian represents a change in developmental program rather than change in selective regime” (206). This is enough to undermine Dawkins’s assumption that “these evolutionary changes can be understood as the replacement of one allele by another in the context of invariant systems of gene regulation and expression” (202).

Maureen Kearney’s review of the triumph of phylogenetic systematics (cladism) over rival theories of classification contains echoes of the developmentalist themes to which I have been pointing. Cladism says that branching points alone, not perceived similarities, should be used to construct classifications. Cladists rejected efforts by the rival pheneticist school to make classification more empirical (as in logical empiricism) by identifying and sorting through more characters than traditional practitioners of the art of taxonomy. Instead, cladists appealed to Popper’s falsificationist norms by assuming that nature’s branching points could always be counted on to take the most parsimonious path. Still, in constructing their parsimonious cladograms of ancestral and descendent species they typically used conventional diagnostic characters, if fewer. Kearney reports, however, that this method is now being overtaken by efforts to “order things into systems on the basis of the natural process by which their parts [rather than sums of traits] are related” (231). Jason Roberts’s chapter on systems biology testifies to this anticipated shift. Having found their way through genome sequencing programs to a mother lode of information, Roberts reports that even molecular geneticists are now calling for a new “systems biology” that will integrate genetic with other sorts of data. Since the systems in question are developmental, Roberts applauds “molecular biologists’ apparent realization (finally!) that developmental systems … are dynamic, temporal, and mutable rather than static” (368).

I conclude this section by noting that, in contrast to the genocentrism that still dominates popular science writing about evolution, contemporary philosophers of biology sense that the link between phylogeny and ontogeny is returning to its previous centrality. Nowhere in the Cambridge Companion, though, is one pressing issue squarely addressed: What precisely is the relation between population genetics and the new developmentalism? The role of developmental plasticity in negotiating the complex, dynamical interaction between genotypes and phenotypes, as in the work of Mary Jane West Eberhard, would be a good place to look.

I turn finally to essays on human evolution. Developmental themes are less prominent in these chapters. One reason might be that for the last several decades questions about human evolution have been dominated by attempts to capture this subject for gene-centered versions of the Modern Synthesis by appealing to kin selection and game theory to explain cooperative and altruistic behavior. (The role of game theory in this work is well summarized in Zachary Ernst’s chapter.) As a result, debates about human evolution still reflect old quarrels about whether cultural processes are products of natural selection, but now work autonomously — the orthodox Dobzhanskyan view set forth in the Cambridge Companion by Francisco Ayala — or whether human traits, including our sexual proclivities and cognitive quirks, are distinct adaptations. The latter hypothesis was first proposed in E. O. Wilson’s Sociobiology (1975). As David Buller explains in his chapter, Wilson’s sociobiology had two successor programs. One is Evolutionary Psychology, which postulates distinct mental modules for different psychological functions and regards each module as a domain-specific adaptation. The other is human behavioral ecology, which, in Dobzhansky’s spirit, treats the human mind as a highly plastic domain-general capacity for managing the trade-offs on which adaptedness in cultural niches depends. Buller expresses a decided preference for the latter.

A similar preference can be found in Valerie Hardcastle’s report on trends in neurobiology. Extreme modularism underestimates the noise-signal ratio in brain functions and the plasticity of the brain, leading Hardcastle to skepticism about too quickly adjusting public policy (toward potential criminals for example) under the influence of fads in cognitive neuroscience. This sort of cautionary skepticism can also be felt in chapters that deal with other issues where evolutionary science is supposed to ground public policies. Sahotra Sarkar, for example, points out the disconcertingly thin mathematical and empirical grounds on which policies aimed at protecting biodiversity actually rest.

Presumably, philosophers of biology can be persuasive witnesses on topics where biology meets ethics, law, and public policy because they are supposed to know their way around is-ought logics. Nonetheless, their interventions will fail to persuade the public unless philosophers bear in mind the evolution-religion matrix with which bioethical issues are hopelessly entangled. Robert Pennock’s chapter on biology and religion is helpful because it rises above the debaters’ points that dominate public discussion of creationism, sexuality, environmentalism, biotechnology, and other such issues. All these controversies, Pennock argues, have a common thread — whether nature is so inherently value-laden that it dictates norms of behavior. In the modern West, religion (except of the most liberal sort) still sticks up for this natural law tradition. Oddly, however, in opposing its religious form Sociobiologists and Evolutionary Psychologists perpetuate the normative assumptions of this tradition.

Consider homosexuality. In his chapter on the subject Christopher Horvath summarizes evidence pointing to some heritability of male homosexuality, but puts more stress on the non-heritable, but still decidedly biological effects of birth order. (A statistically higher level of homosexuality in younger sons correlates with immune responses in mothers who have already borne a number of children.) Since ought implies can Horvath says these facts call for tolerance. They remind us “to treat all people with respect and dignity regardless of their sexual orientation” (303). But this little sermon still leaves open whether homosexuality, compelled or not, is morally good, bad, or indifferent. This loaded question is usually, and badly, framed against an assumed background of masculinist heternormativity. The fact that sociobiologists and their successors often defend male centered heterosexuality as natural is not unconnected with the concessive tone of their claim that childless or gay uncles and aunts can still contribute to overall fitness through kin selection. They also serve. But those who take this line, like those who postulate a “gay gene,” are assuming that moral goodness depends on adaptedness. Pennock points out that they are defending the normativity of nature no less than those who say that the heritability of religion means that there must be a “god gene.” “Applying” evolutionary hypotheses to human practices in this way is no better a game than Paley’s natural theory. Indeed, it is the same game. It not only pulls ought out of is, but has a bad track record. In retrospect, it is clear that prejudices and pipedreams, not ineluctable facts, have generated and protected from criticism once cherished notions about the biological basis of free markets, eugenics, and, in the era of feminism, heterosexual male dominance.

This Cambridge Companion, like others, is not a general survey. Rather, readers will encounter well-informed and analytically skilled minds grappling at close quarters with biology’s most interesting issues. Since philosophy of biology is a generally naturalistic discipline — it tends to treat conceptual and empirical claims as thoroughly intertwined — readers will also discover that they are picking up a lot of up-to-date biology. In view of evolutionary biology’s entanglement with questions of value, however, philosophers of biology should reflect as much on the cultural history of the life sciences as on biological science itself. As it is, Robert Richards’s chapter on why it is unfair to blame Ernst Haeckel for Nazism is the only essay on this theme. The exoneration of a great scientist from the crude fallacy of reductio ad Hitlerum is fine. But it should not be allowed to displace the overall record of biologists who have called on nature to bless certain social arrangements. The volume could also use a bit more reflection on the nature and uses of philosophy of biology itself.


Matthen, M. & A. Ariew. (2002). “Two ways of thinking about fitness and natural selection,” Journal of Philosophy 99: 55-83.

Walsh, D., T. Lewens, & R. Ariew. (2002). “The trials of life: natural selection and random drift,” Philosophy of Science 69: 452-73.

Walsh, D. (2006). “Evolutionary essentialism,” British Journal for Philosophy of Science 57: 425-448.