The Cambridge History of Philosophy in the Nineteenth Century (1790-1870)

Placeholder book cover

Allen W. Wood and Songsuk Susan Hahn (eds.), The Cambridge History of Philosophy in the Nineteenth Century (1790-1870), Cambridge University Press, 2012, 1006pp., $180.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521772730.

Reviewed by Judith Norman, Trinity University


This volume of essays by leading scholars aims to give "a comprehensive account of [European] philosophy" in the nineteenth century -- or rather, a short nineteenth century that runs in fact from 1790 to 1870 (although the volume officially includes Nietzsche as well). The 28 chapters are not devoted to individual philosophers or movements, but rather to philosophical themes. The majority of the themes concern social, political, and moral philosophy. Two chapters explore trends in the sciences and philosophies of science, and one looks at the emergence of the human sciences. Developments in logic and mathematics each get a chapter, as do psychology, language, and aesthetics. There are three chapters on religion and three on theories and philosophies of history. Two chapters are devoted to early philosophical responses to Kant. A historical chapter looks at the development of the university in Germany, and a philosophical one assesses the impact of the French revolution on philosophy. The essays are almost uniformly excellent, and the volume is, overall, a real boon to historical scholarship. In what follows I will discuss some aspects of the distinctive picture of the nineteenth century that it presents.

Although this is not the first history of nineteenth century philosophy to organize its contents by topic rather than by movements or figures, the organization has a nicely defamiliarizing effect. There is no dedicated, stand-alone, comprehensive discussion devoted to the Young Hegelians, for instance, or to Romanticism. Accordingly, none of the articles brings Feuerbach's ideas into systematic relation with those of Hegel (although several of the articles mention the relation), or refers F. Schlegel to Fichte. The author of the Birth of Tragedy is not identified with the author ofThus Spoke Zarathustra. Instead, Nietzsche (just to take this example) is parceled out: the Birth of Tragedy is considered (in a single, passing sentence) as a theory of language and (elsewhere) as a contributor to the fluctuating popularity of Aristotle in nineteenth century histories of philosophy; On the Genealogy of Morality puts in a brief appearance as a text in the development of historicist views of the human sciences, but is treated at length alongside Max Stirner as a specimen of antimoralism (in the excellent chapter devoted to this topic). Zarathustra is barely mentioned, presumably because it does not contribute to any of the themes that were chosen for inclusion in the volume.

Although I do have some issues with the picture of Nietzsche that emerges in the volume (which I will discuss below), I see no problem in theory with this method of distributing his ideas and works among separate thematic contexts. It is pleasantly deflationary, and blocks the sort of "author as hero" mystifications to which Nietzsche is particularly prone. It is also useful to break up and distribute figures who would normally be treated in the context of movements -- to see, again, Max Stirner discussed (at length) as an anti-moralist first and Young Hegelian second -- and to read his relation to Marx in this specific, illuminating context. In terms of (or instead of) a systematic summary of early German romanticism, we get the same sort of coverage of individual authors in different, theme-based contexts. Friedrich Schlegel (unlike the rather neglected figure of Novalis) comes off particularly well. He is cited (along with Wilhelm von Humboldt) in Michael N. Forster's "Language," as one of the founders of modern linguistics, and also, in Forster's excellent "The History of Philosophy," as the "greatest innovator" in the development of the study of the history of philosophy. These are unexpected ways to highlight the contributions of Schlegel, but both stories are convincingly told.

A consequence of this privilege of topics over figures or movements is that it helps loosen the grip of nationalism in defining philosophical trends by encouraging German ideas to be considered alongside French and English ones: the English might not have contributed to German Idealism, but Germans and Brits both had something to say about the nation-state. (Interestingly, German Idealism is the one philosophical movement that is treated as a unified whole with two more or less dedicated chapters, most notably Robert Pippin's very strong first chapter on "The Kantian Aftermath." The principal figures are then dispersed, Schelling to the sciences and arts, Fichte to ethics and nationalism, and Hegel pretty much everywhere.) However, this cosmopolitan approach works better in theory than in practice, as many of the articles have a seam down the middle that divides the conversations in England and France from those in Germany.

A further consequence of the topic-based organization is that it exacerbates the artificiality of the dates that form the starting and stopping points of the volume. Positivism, for instance, is a movement where there is some consensus as to the beginning, middle and end, but a topic such as aesthetics will necessarily begin in progress. A good deal of the artificiality about the starting point, at least, is relieved by the figure of Kant, who seems like the natural beginning for so many of these topics -- an appearance that would, accordingly, be inconvenient for this volume to challenge. The French revolution also functions as a natural starting-point for many of the discussions (although to its great merit, Frederick Beiser and Pamela Edwards' "Philosophical Responses to the French Revolution" contests this, suggesting that the revolution merely "polarized and accelerated" (p. 613) existing intellectual developments). The ending point of 1870 is a bit more artificial and unevenly enforced. Dilthey and Frege are smuggled in fairly extensively. (This will not be apparent from the wildly inaccurate index, which systematically omits substantial references and conflates figures, for instance Max Weber and Ernst Heinrich Weber. The electronic page proofs of the volume however are publicly accessible at

One fairly major change in philosophical thinking that Beiser and Edwards plausibly claim to be the result of the French Revolution is a shift away from theoretical philosophy towards more practical concerns:

Before the revolution, the problem [of the authority of reason] concerned essentially the limits of theoretical reason, the power of reason in metaphysics or epistemology. After the revolution, the problem involved more the limits of practical reason, especially the power of reason to guide our conduct in the social and political world. (p. 609)

The plan of the volume seems to concede the point: practical philosophical themes are much better represented than any others. There is no chapter devoted to metaphysics. Pippin, in the first chapter on "The Kantian Aftermath," argues strongly for a Kantian, non-metaphysical reading of German Idealism: that Hegel in particular was faithful to the epistemological project of the first critique, and his system (and particularly his historicism) was largely a result of rendering consistent certain of Kant's epistemic commitments. Epistemology appears, then, under the cover of German Idealism. Outside of this context, no chapter is dedicated to epistemology other than an excellent one on specifically moral epistemology by J. B. Schneewind and Allen Wood (who discuss British and French debates about intuitionism, utilitarianism, and spiritualism before discussing the German rationalist tradition from Kant). Epistemology is discussed elsewhere only to the extent that it complicates or clarifies the progressive self-definition of other fields. Jeremy Heis describes the problems of divorcing logic as a formal discipline from Kant's epistemological commitments in "Attempts to Rethink Logic." Gary Hatfield refers to the complicated turf war between epistemology and empirical psychology in his account of the development of psychology. Philippe Huneman describes the development of epistemologies specific to the natural sciences, and Rudolf Makkreel recounts Dilthey's attempts to formulate epistemologies of the human sciences that would be distinct from these. A similar story can be told for metaphysics. (The significant role of Lotze in resuscitating metaphysics and transforming the meaning and function of theories of knowledge in the aftermath of speculative idealism is also widely acknowledged in many of these contexts.) But the reader coming to the text with the question "what happened to (non-moral) epistemology and metaphysics in the nineteenth century?" will have some work to do to piece together an answer.

* * * * * * * * * *

The topic-based approach inevitably generates some overlap between the essays, as figures who contribute to a number of themes need to be reintroduced and their basic ideas re-summarized. The large number of articles clustered around social and political themes exacerbates this redundancy as basic Comtean ideas, for instance, (the three stages of history) are explained no fewer than five times. Occasionally the overlap takes the form of contradiction. Coleridge appears, confusingly, as a leading player in James Livingston's "The Defense of Traditional Religion, 1790-1870," and also in Stephen Crites's essay as an exponent of two of the "Three Types of Speculative Religion," which are presented as distinctive alternatives to traditional religion.

At its best, the redundancy is not simply repetition but a variety of complementary ways of viewing the same author. It also serves to emphasize just how widely the influence and expertise of some thinkers really extended. Mill seems to be everywhere. Marx, to take another example, also appears frequently, with discussions of various aspects of his work distributed over 12 chapters. His materialism is treated as a contribution to natural sciences in one chapter, and to the debate over the methodological autonomy of the humanities in another. His critique of individualism is seen as a contribution to the decline of natural right theory, as well to the development of an ethical ideal of social solidarity. His challenge to religion is discussed in relation to Feuerbach, his challenge to morality in relation to Stirner, his revolutionary politics is contrasted to that of Bakunin and Blanqui, his theory of political economy is compared to that of Ricardo, and his speculative theory of history is discussed as a (quasi-)synthesis of Hegel and Comte.

Again, these treatments of Marx are not always mutually consistent. In his chapter on "Philosophy of History: The German Tradition from Herder to Marx", John Zammito sees Marx as a crux point, the culminating and final failure of the grand Hegelian, nineteenth century project of "speculative history," with the more promising, albeit less heady, project of a "historical sociology" rising from the ashes. Yet, his portrait of Marx's idealistic/romantic totalizing moral vision of a utopian society is summarily dismissed in a couple of sentences by Christine Blaettler in "Social Dissatisfaction and Social Change": "Marx did not bother to map out a communist utopia. Rather, he concentrated his efforts on analyzing the ruling capitalist system in order to be able to criticize it adequately." (p. 782).

The conflict here is not merely that of scholarly perspective: there are many sides to Marx. But in dividing these many sides among many different single-topic articles, the articles risk becoming one-sided. We get a misleading view of Marx if, for instance, we view him primarily as the proponent of high-minded (though failed) utopian ideals, as is the case with Zammito, as well as with John Skorupski ("Ethics and the Social Good"). Skorupski contrasts Marxism to Mill's liberalism and worries that, in contrast to Mill, Marx's "conflict-free" utopian, communist society would present a "stifling mediocrity of ideals." This sort of worry is perhaps the result of reading Marx in too philosophically narrow a context. If we give the three hefty volumes of Capital their rightfully central place in Marx's works rather than his few scattered and speculative paragraphs on society in the absence of division of labor under communism, it is clear that Blaettler's assessment is the more reasonable one.

The Marx of Capital is given his dues in Debra Satz's chapter on "Nineteenth-Century Political Economy," which is, in my opinion, the finest essay in the volume. (It is one of the few articles, incidentally, to weave English and German contributions into a coherent narrative.) The contrast that Satz really brings to the fore is not between the different theories of nineteenth century political economy, but between the classical political economists taken together, and the neo-classical marginalist economists at the (wrong) end of the century. Viewed in this light, Marx looks a lot more like Ricardo, Mill, and even Adam Smith than we might expect (or he might want). Smith's innovation, Satz explains, "was to see the market as a form of social organization." Smith, Malthus, Ricardo, Mill, and Marx -- each had a conception of the market as social, and was animated by "a vision of the social injustices wrought by the unequal bargaining power of labor, land and capital" (p. 689).

By stripping political economy of its politics and abstracting out a conception of the market divorced from cultural or social considerations, neoclassical economists are generally credited with developing the first successfully predictive model of pricing. Satz contests this achievement, on moral as well as economic grounds. The marginalists developed a highly abstract model of a limited set of economic interactions at the cost of an analysis of -- or concern for -- the role of power relations in dynamically changing economic life, or worries about the equal distribution of social product. Marx and his contemporaries had a much more humane and comprehensive set of concerns.

Accordingly, one of the achievements of this essay is to give greater nuance to the general picture that emerges through many of the essays of the nineteenth century as the age when science, so to speak, got its act together -- often, as in the case of the natural sciences, psychology, and mathematics, by divorcing itself from philosophy. (There is a similarly intelligent nostalgia at the end of the "Challenges to Religion in the Nineteenth Century" chapter, where Van Harvey looks back at the cognitive content of early nineteenth century theology with something like regret in the face of contemporary "therapeutic" conceptions of religion.) But another achievement of Satz, to return to the discussion of the many sides of Marx, is giving much greater nuance to the notion of Marx (or indeed Smith) as a moral philosopher. If Satz is right, Marx's concern with unjust market outcomes is a native part of the science of political economy. Frederick Neuhauser concurs, in his discussion of Marx in the context of "Conceptions of Society in Nineteenth-Century Social Thought": "Neither Smith nor Hegel nor Marx subscribed to the positivist view of science, according to which 'scientific' implies 'value-free'." Marx might have many sides, but it would be a mistake to oppose Marx the scientist to Marx the moralist.

* * * * * * * * * *

The emphasis on Marx helps underscore one of the principal themes that emerges in the course of the volume, the development of historicism. There is no stand-alone chapter on historicism, but it is recurs frequently in the particular themes of various chapters, since it is part of (and perhaps primary among) the network of ideas that, as Beiser and Edwards discuss in "Philosophical Responses to the French Revolution," gradually replaced Enlightenment universalist, ratio-centric, and often mechanistic assumptions about human nature and the social (and natural) order with an organic model of society (and nature!) that gave scope to tradition, custom, and regional identity. Some of the more interesting discussions occur in Forster's "Language," Makkreel's "The Emergence of the Human Sciences from the Natural Sciences," and Jeremy Waldron's "The Decline of Natural Right." The emergence of historicist methodology is discussed in Laurence Dickey's "Philosophizing about History: The Method of Zusammernhang." The novelty and significance of historicizing nature is explored in Huneman's "Natural Sciences." Pippin, as I have mentioned, attributes Hegel's historicism to his Kantian commitments. Historicist assumptions play a role in the growth of religious skepticism, as history assumed from theology the task of explaining biblical (Strauss) as well as natural (Darwin) phenomena, as recounted in Harvey's excellent "Challenges to Religion in the Nineteenth Century."

The conspicuous presence of the theme of historicism gives an interestingly self-reflexive character to the volume as a whole: that the nineteenth century is the period when philosophers began systematically to reflect on and privilege the role of historical self-understanding in various intellectual disciplines, very much including philosophy itself. Accordingly, the volume ends with Forster's very capable reflection of the history of philosophy on its own conditions. Forster draws lessons from his discussion, enumerating some of what he takes to be the more valuable methodological tools developed by nineteenth century historiographers of philosophy. Hegel necessarily looms large in this discussion, and although his teleological conception of philosophical progress is perhaps best left in the nineteenth century, Forster lauds his "proto-Marxist" method of viewing philosophy in a historical, and specifically sociopolitical, context. In fact, Forster's discussion culminates with an encomium to Marxian ideology-critique and a strong and convincing argument for its continued relevance and urgency, particularly when abstracted from the narrowly economic context in which Marx developed it and generalized into an analysis of the manner in which ideas conceal and reinforce power relations in many different spheres. He demonstrates the power of the method by critiquing various contemporary philosophical ideas as ideological. It is a good way to end the volume, a lesson, perhaps, that the nineteenth century has sharp and effective instruments for judging our present and finding it lacking, and that we ignore its judgments at our peril.

The volume as a whole certainly does a good job of tying many nineteenth century ideas to historical events, by including both a chapter by Terry Pinkard on the "The Social Conditions of Philosophy in the Nineteenth Century" (which actually focuses on the development of the German university) as well as Beiser and Edward's chapter on the French Revolution. The weight of historical events is also appropriately registered in many of the articles.[1] But few of the authors engage in genuine ideology-critique. The method is most closely approximated in the chapter on "Challenges to Religion in the Nineteenth Century," where Harvey, in a classically Marxian move, treats the rise of anti-religious criticism as a displacement of political anti-authoritarianism. Erica Benner's otherwise strong chapter "The Nation-State" might have mentioned Mill's life-long job as an administrator for the East India Company in connection with his political writings in defense of the civilizing potentials of imperial conquest. Benner views Mill's illiberal conceptions in the softening light cast by "the context of his times," but it's hard to believe that his day job was quite irrelevant to this context.

Forster extracts another piece of methodological advice from Hegel who observed that

[first,] philosophy's characteristic functions are often performed by other areas of culture, and, second, that philosophy and other areas of culture often influence each other deeply. Taking these two points to heart would arguably forestall a number of common errors in history of philosophy. (p. 889)

(Forster gives as an example the error of neglecting the philosophical positions of Greek tragedians.) Judged by this criterion, the volume is mostly successful. Many of the chapters take seriously the interplay between philosophy and "other areas of culture," and the philosophical input of practitioners from those other areas.

Janet Folina's excellent "Some Developments in the Philosophy of Mathematics, 1790 - 1870" focuses primarily (although not exclusively) on "philosophical views of practicing mathematicians" (p. 133), as this was a period when the distinction between the two fields was itself up for revision. Mathematics was entering into closer and more fruitful relations with logic even as it was starting to leave behind some of the philosophical constraints presented by contemporary theories of meaning and reference that hindered the development of negative and imaginary numbers, for instance. In Huneman's chapter on "Natural Sciences," we get ample discussion of the contribution of Darwin and other practicing scientists. Similarly Hatfield ("Psychology") looks closely at the development of sensory physiology as it contributed to the growth of empirical, experimental psychology. Livingston's "The Defense of Traditional Religion, 1790-1870" has lengthy descriptions of theologians (indeed, John Henry Newman is as prominent a figure in the volume as Kierkegaard). Waldron's excellent "The Decline of Natural Right" looks at natural right rhetoric in law, politics, and the struggle against slavery in the US (and Haiti). And finally, Blaettler, in "Social Dissatisfaction and Social Change," includes a variety of social theorists, political activists and pamphleteers who advance the struggles, both theoretical and practical, on behalf of workers' and women's rights, and in opposition to slavery. One of the benefits of looking at how philosophical positions were developed in and advanced by this particular area of culture is that it allows for the inclusion of women in the story of nineteenth century philosophy.[2]

One philosophically informed area of culture that is less well represented is the arts. It is certainly not absent. Coleridge in particular is included in several essays (but only the Coleridge of theBiographia Literaria, not Coleridge the poet). The views of the art historian, John Ruskin, are also considered in Paul Guyer's "The Beautiful and the Good: Aesthetics, 1790-1870 ." Wood presents De Sade as an avatar of "Antimoralism" (only to dismiss him as insufficiently philosophical, and the 20th century thinkers who have tried to take him seriously are described as "fools" (p. 496). If so, Wood might have done better to devote his attention to the more obviously philosophically motivated antimoralism of Kierkegaard, who is seriously under-represented in this volume.)

Literature itself puts in a brief appearance in the interestingly conceived "Nineteenth Century Ideals: Self-Culture and the Religion of Humanity" by Daniel Brudney. He looks below the surface of ethics, as it were, to some of the underlying ideals of human development. Specifically, Brudney argues, the ideal of individual self-cultivation was theorized alongside and in uneasy competition with that of altruistic humanitarianism. Focusing on these ideals proves to be an excellent mechanism for illuminating broader changes in political and ethical thinking, most prominently the way in which humanitarianism takes on the mantle of certain forms of religious devotion, for instance in Mill and Feuerbach. In doing so, Brudney feels free to call upon fictional models of human ideals, in George Eliot, Kierkegaard, and Dickens, among others, and to draw on theoretical remarks by Emerson, Oscar Wilde, and Matthew Arnold.

Although the arts are not neglected entirely, I wish there were a dialogue with the arts as rich in scope as the dialogues with science, religion, and politics. The nineteenth century is an age in which philosophical issues were explored in artistic media in a way unprecedented except perhaps by the Greek tragedians. Yet, there is little mention of the contributions of philosophically literate artists (except Coleridge), or the works of Wagner and Dostoevsky. Although one of the essays includes the claim that "existentialism has roots in the ethically fertile soil of the nineteenth century" (p. 434), this volume does little to prepare for it. Very cursory attention is paid to Kierkegaard (his literary form is never thematized). With the exception of Brudney's "Nineteenth Century Ideals," no serious attention is given to texts that begin to explore the role of literature in articulating philosophically significant experiences and furthering philosophical conversations, such as we see in Dostoevsky, Kierkegaard, Novalis, and even Nietzsche's Zarathustra. Moreover, although several articles (most notably, Forster's n "Language") point to the significance of music for providing a pre-linguistic form of meaning, there is no mention of Wagner's large and self-conscious role in furthering this discussion or in contributing to the related development of the metaphysics of will.

Indeed, there is disproportionately little attention to aesthetics: only a single chapter (by Guyer) despite the tremendous significance aesthetic thought had for nineteenth century philosophy and vice versa. It is a strong chapter, in which Guyer looks at a variety of nineteenth century aesthetic theories through the lens of the relation between aesthetic and moral thought. This proves to be a loose enough organizing principle for him to bring together British and Continental theories (and even the American Emerson) and has the curious result of elevating the significance of philosophical observations by John Ruskin, with whom the chapter concludes.

But despite the considerable interest of this wide-ranging and illuminating theme, there are necessarily topics that fall outside of its scope but which are not picked up elsewhere. Those topics primarily involve the arts and philosophies of art (as opposed to aesthetics). It is hard to wish for this volume to be even longer than it is, but there are issues of consistency: Huneman's "Natural Sciences" takes appropriate note of the very significant fact that the word "scientist" was first coined in 1833 (by Whewell) and indicates a radical reordering of the status of knowledge of nature (he tells a similar story about the term "biology"). But the volume does not take note of the fact that the term "literature" also first appears in its modern sense in the nineteenth century, and is associated with a similarly philosophically significant reordering of knowledge, involving a re-conception of human creativity and a revolutionary function for the imagination.

* * * * * * * * * *

This volume aims to give a comprehensive account of philosophy in the nineteenth century. It does a remarkably impressive job, and my short discussion does not do anything like justice to the breadth and insightfulness of the essays. Of course it necessarily falls short of the impossible standard of comprehensiveness that it sets for itself. (It fails to mention Schelling's middle period texts on the philosophy of time, for instance.) There must be some criteria for significance, although this brings in the perhaps unwelcome question of who the account ought to be significant to. Does the volume focus on philosophy significant within the nineteenth century, or significant to us? Each of these options contains many more distinctions, as each century offers a number of plausible perspectives on significance.

The volume, I think, does a good job of splitting the difference, although I have pointed to several areas that I think could have received more coverage. It takes due note of figures such as Lotze and Trendelenburg, and issues such as the atheism and materialism controversies, all of which were of enormous significance in the nineteenth century, although they are often neglected in standard accounts of the period. (And it includes figures like de Sade and Wollstonecraft who were not read in the nineteenth century but became popular later.) But there is a slightly more subtle question of significance, when we look not merely at thinkers but at perspectives on them. Did nineteenth century readers have the same interests in Schopenhauer (for instance) that contemporary philosophers do? Here at least, I think the answer is no. The volume gives a misleading portrait of philosophers such as Schopenhauer and Nietzsche by focusing too exclusively on issues of interest to some Anglo-American scholars at the expense of other issues that are not so currently popular but have been of greater significance both historically and at present, outside these narrow debates.

Schopenhauer (to keep with the example), was an enormously popular figure in the latter half of the century: Pinkard notes that he was "the most widely read philosopher after the failures of the 1848 revolutions in Germany" (p. 57). His popularity and influence revolve around his pessimistic metaphysics of will, but his pessimism and metaphysics are only touched. In one of the two substantial discussions[3] of Schopenhauer ("Autonomy and the Self as the Basis for Morality"), Bernard Reginster dismisses the will as "a source of perplexity" and devotes his discussion to an analysis of the role of compassion in moral deliberation vis-à-vis Kant, and its compatibility with the notion of morality as autonomy. It is a fine discussion, but this is not the Schopenhauer who riveted the late nineteenth century and inspired Tristan und Isolde. Guyer discusses Schopenhauer's metaphysics in the context of the aesthetics, but summarizes it briefly on the way to the topic at hand, the relation between aesthetics and ethics. Again, this is perfectly reasonable (since his is the sole essay on nineteenth century aesthetics, Guyer has more than enough on his plate). But it is regrettable that no essay does justice to the primacy of Schopenhauer's pessimistic metaphysics or the extent of its influence, which extends not merely to Wagner but inaugurates a philosophical lineage associated with Freud and the conception of the unconscious in psychology.

Similar concerns can be raised about Nietzsche: the volume is more comfortable placing Nietzsche in the role of critic than in exploring aspects of his positive philosophy, such as the will to power. The notion of the Übermensch is never mentioned and, as I have said, there is very little discussion of the Birth of Tragedy or Zarathustra. Indeed, the volume would leave the reader with the impression that Schlegel was the foremost exponent of the concept of the Dionysian in German philology, and Blanqui the primary figure associated with the notion of eternal recurrence. These are perplexing texts and perplexing concepts, but Nietzsche's thought is hardly comprehensible (and certainly not complete) without them, and there is no doubt as to their influence on subsequent philosophy.

I am speaking of course in the comfortable role of the critic, which is to say as someone who was not presented with the Herculean task of trying to get twenty-seven different authors to collectively compress the achievements of nineteenth century philosophy into nine hundred short pages. There cannot help but be omissions and oversights, and even a scholar of middle period Schelling can admit that the volume has done a magnificent job.

[1] Interestingly, Wood ("Antimoralism") engages ably in the neglected nineteenth century art of "sketching the character" of many of the philosophers he describes, by way of illuminating their positions.

[2] It is regrettable in this context that Zammito attributes a passing remark to a woman identified simply as Voltaire's mistress, when the person in question, Émilie du Châtelet, was a prominent eighteenth century physicist and mathematician.

[3] There are several informative minor discussions as well, which explore his role as a critic of Christianity and reader of Buddhist texts.