The Cambridge Introduction to Emmanuel Levinas

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Michael L. Morgan, The Cambridge Introduction to Emmanuel Levinas, Cambridge University Press, 2011, 259pp., $24.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521141062.

Reviewed by Peter Atterton, San Diego State University


Several years ago I had the privilege of reviewing and qualifiedly endorsing Michael L. Morgan's Discovering Levinas (Cambridge University Press, 2007). When I accepted the invitation to review The Cambridge Introduction to Emmanuel Levinas, I did so on the assumption that it would not, unless clearly stated on the book's back cover or on the Cambridge University Press web site, consist mainly of material derived from the earlier book. But I was wrong. As Morgan explains in the preface, when Discovering Levinas was about to appear in paperback, the editors at Cambridge suggested that he "abridge and revise the book with an eye to introducing Levinas to readers and students who wanted a clear and helpful initial guide to understanding his thinking" (p. vii). The Cambridge Introduction to Emmanuel Levinas is the result of that effort, and at under half of the length of Discovering Levinas, it is a much leaner, more focused book that is basically an abridgement of its predecessor.

To be sure, the book does contain some original material, principally by way of a fourteen-page Introduction and nine-page Conclusion ("Conclusions, Puzzles, and Problems"). The long penultimate paragraph of Chapter 4 (p. 112), the last four pages of Chapter 5 (pp. 132-135), and the last six pages of Chapter 6 (pp. 155-160) also appear to have been written especially for the volume (not counting a relatively small number of transitional paragraphs). The rest of the book comprises three complete (Chapters 2, 3, and 7) and five abridged (1, 4, 5, 6, and 8) chapters of Discovering Levinas. There are some alterations in the footnotes of Chapters 2 and 3 (Chapter 7 is identical), but surely not enough to substantiate Morgan's claim that he has made "significant modifications" "in every case" to the book's eight chapters for the purpose of uniformity, etc. For the most part the abridgment poses no obvious unifying issue, with one exception. On page 197, during a fascinating and important discussion of theodicy, Morgan begins talking out of the blue about Levinas's review of Philippe Nemo's book Job and the Excess of Evil, leaving the unsuspecting reader disoriented and confused. The two-page lead-up discussion included in the earlier book was simply excised in the later book, with nothing to replace it. This is apt to happen where already published chapters are shortened or rearranged; but it is still not something I expected to encounter from such a prestigious press.

The question I will ask, then, is what special value this book can have for its intended buyer and reader, important enough to justify reprinting much of the earlier work. The simple answer to this question is that it does a far better job at doing what the first book was only able to do with limited success. The problem with Discovering Levinas is that it tried to do too much; it was intended to be an introductory text that aimed to make plausible Levinas's kinship with various important Anglo-American philosophers, while also offering a survey of the development of Levinas's ethics, as well as being an examination of Levinas's involved connection with Judaism, religion, and politics. Although these are worthy goals in their own right, they did not sit very comfortably with each other. The elimination of those chapters and discussions in particular that required special background knowledge of analytic philosophy, and the focus instead on Levinas's central texts and themes do much, I think, to enhance significantly the book's value as an introductory text.

Morgan opens and closes (before the Conclusion) The Cambridge Introduction to Emmanuel Levinas by situating Levinas's thinking in the context of the massive political upheavals of the twentieth century, especially Hitlerism, Stalinism, and Zionism. Chapter 1 is a discussion of Vasily Grossman's Life and Fate, an epic novel about life on the eastern front during the Battle of Stalingrad (1942-1943). Levinas was compulsively drawn to the novel and would invoke its scenes of human suffering and moral sacrifice to attest to his own descriptions of ethics again and again in essays and interviews in the 1980s. The rudiments of Levinas's ethics, including the power of the Other to stimulate gratuitous acts of kindness, the critique of the totality (and, a fortiori, totalitarianism), the crisis of modernity ("the decline of the West"), are clearly set out here at the beginning of Morgan's book, and further clarified, refined, and applied in many of the later chapters. Indeed, the chapter works well not only as a way into Levinas's thought, but also as a rare and insightful commentary on Levinas's reading of Grossman.

If I have one nagging doubt it is that the appeal to a work of fiction depicting acts of spontaneous kindness ("as beautiful and as powerless as dew" -- a phrase that Morgan wrongly attributes to Levinas [p. 23], but which actually comes from Grossman's novel[1]) may not be the most appropriate device for introducing Levinas to the first-time reader. This is because Morgan does not raise any sharp questions about the literal truth or falsity of the scenes being described. Certainly, I am not saying that we cannot learn anything from literature; its content may provide material that is philosophically valid and genuinely illuminating. All I am saying is that our acceptance of the truth of literature may be based on its expressive power and aesthetically gratifying features rather than on the insight or knowledge, if any, it provides. It may be that Grossman's work is mistaken for a sign of confirmation of (Levinas's) ethics. To know whether this is so we would need a clearer notion of what is involved in making epistemic claims in literature. And neither Morgan nor Levinas provides this.

Chapter 2 continues the activity of "stage setting" (p. 42). Here Morgan claims to make "a first pass" (p. 37) through Levinas's philosophical thinking, especially its early development, in the context of phenomenology. At this point one normally would expect the author of an introductory text to explain to the reader, in the clearest manner possible, how Levinas's philosophy is indebted to the "phenomenological method," and also to clarify the sense in which Levinas's thinking marks a departure from it. But Morgan conspicuously fails to do either. Unfortunately for his reader, he gets bogged down early on in the chapter in an abstruse debate about transcendental argumentation from which he and his bemused reader (remember this is only the second chapter) never fully emerge, even by the end of the chapter. The debate appeared in the literature nearly twenty-five years ago between Theodore De Boer and Robert Bernasconi concerning the status of the face-to-face, with De Boer claiming that the relation is a transcendental condition of the possibility of ethical experience and Bernasconi complicating matters by pointing out that Levinas himself seemed unable to decide between this and a rival interpretation which sees the face-to-face as a concrete experience that can be empirically ascertained in everyday life.

Morgan himself seems equally unable to decide which side to come down on, the transcendental or empirical (which, to confuse matters even more, he prefers to call "episodic" [p. 43 n22]). Thus we are told in one of the many footnotes that "it seems utterly unavoidable that in some sense or other the face-to-face does occur as an actually lived experience" (p. 43 n23), only to be informed immediately thereafter in the main body of the text that "it seems utterly impossible that the face-to-face could occur in ordinary life" (p. 44). Morgan then spends the next ten pages or so promoting the idea that "Levinas's inquiry should be understood as a transcendental enterprise of a certain sort" (p. 53), only to finish with an "objection" designed to point us in the direction of an empirical reading once more. The explanation of these equivocations and inconsistencies is that Levinas himself is "both an empirical and a transcendental thinker, but neither in a conventional sense" (p. 57). In what sense then? In fact, all Morgan has managed to do by the end of the second chapter is drag his reader down into a black hole of confusion when he really should have been ushering him or her into the light. If Morgan had noticed the lack of payoff for the reader, he might not have been so willing to take the tack that he did. In any event, if one is going to introduce Levinas's thinking to a first-time reader, one had best be clear that Levinas is massively indebted to the phenomenologies of Husserl and Heidegger (Heidegger is hardly mentioned in this chapter and indeed rarely discussed in the book at all); and one certainly ought also then to show how Levinas's thinking constitutes, in different ways, and for different reasons, a powerful critique of them, such that we could begin to understand "how to read Levinas" (p. 36).

Chapter 3, 4, and 5 do the majority of the heavy lifting when it comes to explaining and clarifying Levinas's ethical disquisitions on the face-to-face, totality, and subjectivity spanning his writings from Time and the Other to Totality and Infinity and Otherwise Than Being. Some residue is left over from the discussions of the earlier book that were abridged in the later book in which Morgan attempts to bring Levinas into conversation with twentieth-century Anglo-American philosophers, figures such as Stanley Cavell, Bernard Williams, and Charles Taylor. But these conversations generally do not impede the exposition, and in the case of Cavell's discussion of Wittgenstein on psychological states is genuinely illuminating. Even though I know many readers schooled in Continental philosophy will be a little skeptical about the value to its prospective readers of using analytic jargon to illuminate Levinas's thinking, Morgan offers a mild rebuke on page 128 to those commentators who lapse into mere citation or resort to repeating Levinas's highly unusual language when introducing his thoughts without properly explaining them: "But this strategy is even less satisfying than providing a traveler with a guidebook and then leaving her at the border of a foreign country without an entry visa." Morgan indeed gives the reader an entry visa, though one suspects at times that one is there for the pictures and the sights but never the place, like those tourists who seek out restaurants that serve up familiar fare and protest when the natives don't speak "English." I had this feeling the strongest when I was reading Chapter 5 (pp. 133-135) in which Morgan drew some parallels and connections between Levinas's discussion of subjectivity and discussions of personal identity in Anglo-American circles. I personally found the treatment very useful and rewarding, but I still had the impression I was dining at home.

Chapters 6, 7, and 8 address Levinas and religion, Judaism in particular. Morgan, who is also author of The Cambridge Companion to Modern Jewish Philosophy (Cambridge University Press, 2007), has a complete and firm grasp of the way in which Levinas's philosophy is rooted in part in his Jewish heritage. In chapter 8, he provides his reader with a vast range of material showing how "Levinas's Judaism is taken up with responsibility and justice, obligations that one must learn to understand, acknowledge, and accept for oneself" (p. 193). He also discusses at length Levinas's Zionism in terms of both his Jewish universalism and his "complex" (p. 231) thinking about the State of Israel. If you find nothing narrow or parochial about statements such as "what is important to Israel's teaching is in fact important to all humankind" and that "for all its brute particularity, its life, its suffering, the Jewish people is the soul of humanity, and its essence is universalism" (p. 235), but would like to obtain a deeper insight into how Levinas manages to extricate a universalist meaning from Jewish particularism, then this chapter will be of major use to you.

Morgan also, and commendably, does not balk at addressing the vexed issue of Arab-Jewish relations. He offers a balanced account of what some have seen as problematic remarks Levinas made during a radio interview in 1982 in the aftermath of the massacres of Palestinian refuges at Sabra and Shatila. Levinas was asked whether the "other" of the Israeli was not "above all the Palestinian." Levinas replied that this was not how he understood the Other. While authors such as Howard Caygill[2] have been highly critical of this response, Morgan tries to show how Levinas's reply was consistent with his view that the category of the Other does not operate at the level of identity thinking and politics, and that Levinas's follow-up claim that "a person is more important than a land, even a holy land" (cited p. 233) could also be interpreted as expressing his deep worry and concern that the affairs of state were compromising what Levinas presented as Israel's ethical mission. That doesn't mean to say that Morgan does not see Levinas's response as altogether beyond reproach (see p. 231 n200). It was, after all, a missed opportunity to intervene in the dispute between Jews and Arabs by underscoring the injustice done to the Other -- who includes the Palestinian.

The book's final segment, which I already mentioned was written entirely for The Cambridge Introduction to Emmanuel Levinas, is a welcome addition. It consists of a number of puzzles and problems in Levinas. Some are rather abstract, like the type of criticism we find in Alain Badiou, for example, that Levinas's thinking is totalizing (though Morgan doesn't cite Badiou[3]), and Jacques Derrida's claim that Levinas's thinking is dependent on the ontology it places in question (though here Morgan confesses that he has "nothing to add" [p. 240] to the discussion of Levinas and Derrida). Others are more concrete, like the "over-demandingness" objection that is sometimes posed to Levinas, and his inadequate moral treatment of animals, about which many readers otherwise sympathetic to Levinas are rightly concerned. Morgan doesn't treat these and other criticisms or problems with Levinas at length, as that is outside the scope of the book, but his raising them at the end of his book makes for a nice coda, and, if truth be told, falls like manna into the lap of master's and doctoral students searching for something to write about Levinas.

The one important topic that Morgan fails to discuss -- and indeed this will be judged by many to be a serious shortcoming given the now weighty secondary literature devoted to the subject -- is the role of the feminine in Levinas's work. I am not sure why Morgan passed over this in his book, especially in light of the fact that when Levinas first introduced the face-to-face, in Time and the Other, it was identified with the relation with the feminine. The feminine would become central to both the account of dwelling and the phenomenology of eros in Totality and Infinity, and, qua maternity, becomes a central trope for responsibility in Otherwise Than Being. One would be hard put to divine from Morgan's book why these should not have been considered important enough to introduce to Levinas's first-time reader, whoever she is.

On the whole, then, there is much to justify reprinting originally published material in this slimmer and more accessible volume. I just wish the publisher had let us know in advance that the book is substantially an abridgement of an earlier book on the same press with a different title.

[1] Vasily Grossman, Life and Fate, trans. Robert Chandler (New York: Harper & Row, 1985), p. 409.

[2] Howard Caygill, Levinas and the Political (London: Routledge, 2002).

[3] Alain Badiou, Ethics: An Essay on the Understanding of Evil, trans. Peter Hallward (London & New York: Verso, 2001).